Philosophical Papers: Volumes 1 & 2

Placeholder book cover

Peter Unger, Philosophical Papers: Volumes 1 & 2, Oxford University Press, 2006, 317 + 367pp., $55.00 + $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195155521 (vol 1), 0195301587 (vol 2).

Reviewed by Neil E. Williams, University at Buffalo


Peter Unger's Philosophical Papers brings together essays spanning the full extent of Unger's illustrious career of nearly 40 years (so far). Famous for his radical views, these are the collected papers of a philosophical cowboy: Unger is the furthest thing from conventional, bucking tradition at every turn and carving out his own wild path. This collection traces that path, from the early claims that for every human being there is hardly anything (if anything at all) she knows, to the nihilistic rejection of ordinary objects, through to Unger's denial of his own existence (as well as that of you and me), onto doubts about philosophical method and examples, past (mild) disapproval of our ethical choices, into worries about our presently dominant scientific metaphysic, all ending up with the suggestion that perhaps the only way to be genuinely free is to adopt Cartesian-style substantial dualism. All this, and more, presented in a highly accessible non-technical style that is incredibly insightful and imaginative, and yet humorous and light-hearted throughout.

Though not all of Unger's essays appear in the collection, the two volumes contain 20 essays and 2 book symposia. Nothing substantial has been newly written for the collection, and even the introduction makes no attempt to be "intellectually ambitious". (Unger amusingly suggests that his introduction might just as well have been a James Carville inspired statement: "It's the papers, stupid!".) The essays are arranged thematically: each volume is divided into 4 parts using Unger's book-length works as a rough guide to their grouping. For instance, in the first part of volume 1 the reader is presented with five essays concerning scepticism and knowledge, four that predate and one that follows Unger's defence of scepticism in Ignorance. The parts are then titled accordingly, so that the reader is aware of how the essays in the relevant section are most clearly connected to the topics of the connected books in question. Unger has major works on ethics, language, mind, metaphysics and epistemology; here we find the shorter works that lead up to, into, beneath, and beyond, those longer works.

By arranging things in this way, the reader gets an excellent sense of how the Ungerian corpus is neatly interwoven, a feature of the collection I very much like. Consequently these volumes might be best read alongside Unger's full length works (Unger somewhat shamelessly notes in the introduction that those who find all or some of the essays in Philosophical Papers of interest are welcomed to seek out the associated books, all available -- we are told -- with aesthetically pleasing matched covers), but there's certainly no need to read those other books to understand, or enjoy, the essays in this collection. Unger also includes a chronological list of the papers in the collection, allowing for a sense of transition and development along with the connections.

By way of a simple breakdown of the two volumes, the first volume tends to include essays on epistemology, relativism and ethics, whereas the second is almost exclusively metaphysics. I'll proceed now with a more detailed breakdown and synopsis. That said, I'll mention most of the essays, but I can only discuss a few of them more critically.

Vol. 1 Part i. Skepticism, Nihilism and Scepticism: Before and Beyond Ignorance

The first part of volume one consists of the aforementioned five epistemological essays on knowledge and scepticism. Four of the five essays have as their conclusion some form of global scepticism. Though each takes a different path to that conclusion, Unger consistently treats knowledge as having very high standards, making it very hard (or even impossible) to attain. Though treatments that put a very high standard on knowledge are not currently popular (if ever they were), Unger's sceptical essays are required reading for anyone interested in epistemology.

Vol. 1 Part ii. Comprehending and Transcending Stultifying Common Sense

Two of the three essays in this section are so tightly connected one might think of them as two halves of a much larger essay. "The Causal Theory of Reference" and "Toward a Psychology of Common Sense" both concern our responses to philosophical examples and how any semantic theory ought to be part of a larger more general psychological theory. The first essay starts out as an attack on the causal theory of reference as it applies to ordinary terms like 'cat' or 'gold', but moves into a more general discussion of examples, intuitions and philosophical practice. The second essay starts with a similar discussion of philosophical practice, but moves onto a preliminary sketch of Unger's "Psychological Approach" according to which philosophical examples do not aid in supporting one view or another (of our semantics, say), but rather are treated as little experiments for determining our relative strength of powerful beliefs.

Vol 1. Part iii. Knowledge, Ethics, Contexts: Shades of a Philosophical Relativity

"The Cone Model of Knowledge" and "Contextual Analysis in Ethics" each promotes roughly contextualist positions in the areas of epistemology and ethics, respectively. Neither, however, is offered as a solution to any sort of problem. In the first essay, Unger gives an incredibly complex 'model' of knowledge. It is not, he insists, to be taken as an analysis, as analyses tend to give lists of necessary and sufficient conditions. Though Unger includes certain aspects required for knowledge, they are part of a geographical structure for knowledge and can be satisfied to lesser or greater degrees. Instances of knowledge are situated at different locations on the cone according to the relative strength of the aspects (themselves considered in terms of context); under the high context or standards required to counter global scepticism, all aspects must be as high as they can be (such instances are located at the top of the cone).

Vol 1. Part iv. Defending and Transcending Living High and Letting Die

The final part of volume 1 is a 1999 book symposium on Unger's incredibly popular Living High and Letting Die: Our Illusion of Innocence. Along with a précis of the book, Unger responds to criticism from Brad Hooker, Peter Singer, Thomas Pogge and Fred Feldman. As it turns out, Unger's replies are no more responses to the objections raised than they are attempts to extend some of the main arguments of the book into areas not considered in the book, making them vehicles for the expression of new ideas, and not just restatements of old ones.

That said, I find this symposium to be the least satisfying part of the collection. To my mind, the point of publishing books like Philosophical Papers is to have a group of essays, that are otherwise strewn about the literature, neatly and conveniently collected in one place (or two in this case). For the most part, that's what these volumes do. However, with the symposia we get only half the picture. Unger's writings are presented in full, but the writings of the other contributors (that is, the criticisms Unger is responding to), are omitted. Hence if you're genuinely interested in the exchange, you're going to have to go elsewhere to find the other half of the story, not at all neat or convenient. Nor can those criticisms be reconstructed from Unger's replies: typical of such symposia, limited space demands brevity, so the replies mostly cut to the chase. Perhaps worse still is that Unger's précis leans heavily on his commentators: he indicates that they've done such a good job clearly presenting the central content of the book that he doesn't have to, leaving the present collection with just the thinnest description of the book.

Vol 2. Part i. Three Studies for a Book that Wasn't

Within metaphysical circles, Unger is famous for his nihilism. Few are those philosophers before him who have been so brave as to affirm that much of the world did not exist; none have gone as far as Unger, claiming that even he does not exist. The three essays that make up this section are all directed at very similar conclusions, and are all developed in similar ways. In fact, though each has an ever so slightly different conclusion, and each offers slightly different (and quite interesting) tangential discussion, I think there is too much repetition in these essays to warrant reproducing them all in the present collection. In spite of the overall importance to contemporary metaphysics, we could have made do with just one or two of them, and used the space for some other of Unger's interesting work. It is no help to the charge of redundancy that all three appeared in print in the same year (1979), so it's not as if we're getting different thoughts from different times with changing influences or goals.

Nevertheless, redundancy aside, these are some of the best essays in the collection. The central idea is a simple piece of sorites reasoning: no physical object (a table, or rock, or swizzle stick) is such that the net removal from it of one or two atoms (or molecules, or specks) is such that this should mean the difference between its existing or not. However, as that same (table, rock, swizzle stick) is made of finitely many such atoms, the innocuous step-wise removal of one or two atoms will eventually leave us with nothing at all. One or two atoms, or none at all, are not a (table, rock, swizzle stick). But the thought that there is any stage at which removing one or two atoms makes something no longer be a (table, rock, swizzle stick) is incredible and completely unbelievable, so we have no choice but to give up our belief that there are (tables, rocks, swizzle sticks). With a little more massaging we can add 'person' to that list -- then it follows that neither you, nor I, nor Peter Unger, exists.

Vol 2. Part ii. Many Material Mysteries: Without All the Power in the World

Perhaps as famous as Unger's sorites-based nihilism are the nihilistic conclusions of his "The Problem of the Many." Using the example of a cloud, Unger argues that if the rough collection of droplets that make up a cloud counts as an instance of a cloud, then so should the quadrillion or so other entities that are roughly co-located and differ only by a droplet or two. If there is one cloud, there are numerous -- and this, thinks Unger, means we should give up on there being clouds. As rocks and tables are rather like clouds of atoms, they are out too.

In the final essay in this section, "The Mystery of the Physical and the Matter of Qualities," we get Unger's first foray into 'Scientificalism' -- Unger's name for the presently dominant largely scientific metaphysic. A number of Unger's most recent essays in the collection concern Scientificalism in one way or another; sometimes he is doing his best to flesh out the view, most of the time he poses problems for the compatibility of Scientificalism with freedom or survival. Unger's aim in this essay is to give an account of physical reality, arguing that something like (but not much like) our experience of phenomenal colour must be present in the matter that makes up the world. Unger takes basic physical objects to have three sorts of property: the aforementioned Qualities, Propensities (which are effectively intrinsic causal powers) and Spatials (which are properties as to locations within time and space). According to Unger, without the Qualities, matter simply wouldn't be apt for the occupation of space.

Unger's treatment of physical reality is quite intriguing (if not ingenious), and though I find myself sympathetic to the kinds of properties he argues for, I can find no good reason to support what he calls the "Principle of Contingency (of Relation among the Basic Properties)." The principle is that there can be no necessary connections between which Quality, Propensity, or Spatial properties an object might have. His argument is a conceivability argument: even with similar masses, quantity of matter, and propensities, a physical object might have any of the Qualities: red, blue, grey, gold, silver.

I think we should be generally suspect of conceivability arguments, but even on Unger's own terms I can't see this principle holding. For starters, it has a deeply Humean feel to it, an odd thing to couple with a very anti-Humean metaphysic. It gets worse when we include more of Unger's own view. In supporting the existence of the Qualities, he provides them with a more central role by claiming that some Propensities might be directed towards them. For instance, a 'blue' object might have the propensity to spin 'yellow' objects. He also argues (albeit in a later essay, but as part of the same metaphysic) that the Propensities are reciprocal in nature: if 'blue' objects have the propensity to spin 'yellow' objects, then 'yellow' objects must have the propensity to be spun by 'blue' objects. Finally, Unger claims that having a Propensity does not require that the reciprocal interaction partners (a 'blue' spinner if you are a 'yellow') ever actually interact. Taken together, this seems to demand a necessary relation between the properties, for how can something be a 'yellow' object, and not have the Propensity to be spun by the 'blue' spinners?

Vol 2. Part iii. Defending and Transcending Identity, Consciousness and Value

Here we find the second book symposium, this time for Identity, Consciousness, and Value, and though it too offers some new insights, it has (almost) all the same failings of the previous symposium. The major difference is that this time the précis is more complete. The commentaries, however, are still missing. Located with the second book symposium is "The Survival of the Sentient," a sort of follow up to the book in light of some more forceful 'Biological' approaches to personal identity that seek to counter Unger's 'Psychological' account.

Vol 2. Part iv. True Causes and Real Choices: Still Without All the Power in the World

In the collection's final essay, "Free Will and Scientificalism", Unger argues that the dominant 'Scientifical' metaphysic leaves no room whatsoever for freedom. After further fleshing out the Scientifical account, Unger argues that its incompatibility with freedom is a major blow to the account. Claiming that we'd be hard pressed to give up entirely on either free will or Scientificalism, Unger speculates on ways that Scientificalism might be adjusted to make way for real choosing. His solution is that we might need to endorse some form of radical emergentism of the mental, if not a full blown Cartesian substantial dualism.

In short, these two volumes bring together some excellent papers by one of the greatest contemporary analytic philosophers. And unlike most contemporary analytic philosophers, Unger pulls it off with a style and a sense of humour that is inviting to professionals and laymen alike. Though philosophical vogue tends towards greater specificity and technicality, Unger resists and presents us with a collection of essays that are accessible, enjoyable, and of general interest. Given Unger's wide range of published interests, there is something (if not a few things) in this collection for everyone.