Philosophical Perspectives on Art

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Stephen Davies, Philosophical Perspectives on Art, Oxford University Press, 2007, 279pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199202423.

Reviewed by Christian Helmut Wenzel, National Chi Nan University, Taiwan


This book consists of a collection of articles that appeared between 1984 and 2006, plus an introduction. All articles appeared originally in English, but one has been translated from the Spanish. They are all written in an abstract and argumentative style. Thus the book is analytic and not historical in method. There are also no pictures and very little by way of examples. In the essays, Davies pursues universal and essentialist claims. Officially there are two parts to the book, but due to its being a collection of previously published essays there is naturally much overlap and the dividing line is not clear. The first part is concerned with the distinctive character of artworks, the possibility of defining art, and the question of whether art is universal for all human beings. The second part is about interpretation and appreciation, art's meaning, truth, emotions, and expressiveness.

After his book Themes in the Philosophy of Music of 2003 and the more introductory and student-friendly The Philosophy of Art of 2006 for the Blackwell series Foundations of the Philosophy of the Arts, Davies has put together some less introductory and more demanding essays for his new Philosophical Perspectives on Art of 2007. But the themes and positions are naturally similar to those expressed in his previous work. There are sixteen chapters -- ranging from fundamental discussions about the definition of art, where the author sometimes does indeed "theorize not about the nature of art but about theorizing about art" (23), to more concrete topics such as biology, architecture, metaphors, meaning, and expression in art. Nevertheless, the general mode of thought remains a rather abstract one.

The first essay asks whether art is more like gold or more like parking tickets: in general, "the way we view and categorize the world is shaped by our desires and projects as much as by the world's independent structure" (24); parking tickets are more of the former kind, the results of our desires and projects, whereas gold we think of as existing independently of us. One might be tempted to say that art belongs to the first kind of objects, because it is created by us. But Davies argues that art belongs, similarly to weed and seagulls, to an intermediate domain between gold and parking tickets (essay 1): what counts as a weed or as art depends on us as well as on what we find and meet with in the world around us. I think Davies takes such a position because he believes that art is universal, human, and to be found everywhere, whereas parking tickets are not. Although he prefers to locate art in the domain of culture and not biology (essay 7), he still favors essentialism (essay 2). This seems to me to be why Davies takes an intermediate position regarding the ontology of art. Especially through his essentialist commitment, this is a more traditional position than most of what we find in the second half of the twentieth century. Indeed, Davies says that "the aesthetic, as traditionally understood, has made something of a comeback recently" (28), and if this is true, it seems to me he will be in good company.

Davies defends essentialism against cluster theory if the latter is taken as undercutting essentialism. Saying that something is art if it satisfies, say, eight out of ten criteria, is still, he claims, a way of defining art and therefore still a type of essentialism. “The cluster account deserves to be taken seriously precisely because it provides a plausible description of what kinds of things can make something art. Rather than counting against essentialism in aesthetics, it indicates another way for essentialism to be true" (42). There is much to be said for this, but I don't think it goes as far as Davies wants it to. Cluster theory certainly gives a definition, but an essence derived from this definition is, I think, somewhat fuzzy. Whatever criterion from the list of ten one chooses, it does not need to be met in all cases. It often is, but sometimes is not. This creates fuzziness that is similar to mere family resemblance. It seems to me that Davies underestimates this aspect of fuzziness in cluster theory and the way it affects and somewhat modifies traditional essentialism.

Davies briefly discusses the pros and cons of functionalism and proceduralism, the former claiming that art satisfies a need for aesthetic experience, the latter taking it that art is art in virtue of being baptized as such. After this, there is a slightly longer essay on the notion of non-Western art. Davies begins with the observation that "the members of all cultures have always engaged in storytelling, drawing, carving and whittling, song, dance, and acting or mime" (51), and it therefore does not come as a surprise that he defends a universalist position. The "ubiquity" of these practices "suggests that art is universal" (51). Languages might differ, but concepts don't need to. "The crux concerns the concepts possessed within non-Western cultures, not the vocabularies of their languages" (55). That is certainly true, yet I wonder whether it is that easy. I doubt that the concepts appear to be so universal and language independent once we take a closer look at certain practices and values. Wittgenstein for instance once wrote: "Chinesische Gesten verstehen wir so wenig, wie chinesische Sätze" (Big Typescript), and I think there is a point to this. Although I have sympathy for the idea that "there is a transcultural notion of the aesthetic" (60), I also have some reservations. How difficult things can be is something I have tried to bring out in "Beauty in Kant and Confucius. A First Step", Journal of Chinese Philosophy 33/1 (2006), pp. 95-107.

I have a general worry and concern regarding Davies' analytic approach and many others of its kind (although I am sympathetic to analytic philosophy as much as to historical approaches). Davies' discussion is not only written but also conceived in English and in a certain framework: almost all the literature and theories he refers to are taken from the framework of the English-speaking, analytic literature of the last fifty years. There is no discussion of theories put forward in France or Italy (there is a little discussion of Kant on free and dependent beauty, in essay 6), and there is nothing about Africa or South America. Japan and China have not only produced works of art but also theories of art. If philosophy wants to make universal claims -- and I think it usually does, and justly so -- it will be useful to look into such other traditions as well. Especially if one favors contextualism, as Davies does ("when it comes to the ontology of art, I favor contextualism", 76), this should be an obvious thing to do. Davies also rightly observes that "it is only in confrontation with the 'other', with an intrusive alien presence, that the society is forced to define itself, to reflect on its own character" (55), and I suggest that analytic philosophy, as we know it from the English-speaking traditions of the twentieth century, also has a history and is therefore in need of such a "confrontation", especially when it makes claims to universality.

Art is usually understood as historical and reflexive within the tradition it belongs to. But then there arises the problem of how to explain "first art." Davies faces this problem by

arguing for the existence of aesthetic properties (essay 5). One of the few places where Davies explicitly takes up an issue that is not (at least not only) from the last fifty years of English language discussions is his treatment of free and dependent beauty in Kant. He finds these notions problematic and not convincing. "Six-limbedness counts against beauty in people, but not in Hindu gods or insects". This is true, but Kant would not say that 'six-limbedness' is an object of beauty to start with, because it is too conceptual. Furthermore, Davies observes that "in the later decades of the twentieth century, some analytic philosophers of art challenged the constellation of ideas that made up the inheritance of Enlightenment aesthetics" (86). This is also true, but it sounds as if nothing had happened in Europe during the nineteenth and the beginning of the twentieth century, which certainly is not the case.

Regarding Ellen Dissanayake's evolutionary account of art (essay 7), Davies acknowledges that "her position avoids the trivializing reductions of most ethological approaches, which tie beauty to sexual attractions and see the interest and value of art exhausted by its potential as a tool for seduction" (110), and he also admits that her view "applies most comfortably to what might be called 'low' or 'folk' art" (114). But in the end, he observes, we need more than biological perspectives. We need cultural aspects to account for the more highly-developed art forms, especially for art for its own sake. Dissanayake herself is aware of this, but instead of introducing cultural aspects to account for such art forms, she concludes, according to Davies, that "this comparatively recent European conception of art is aberrant" (114). But it seems to me that Dissanayake might have given up too easily. I think one can make an argument in evolutionary terms even for the case of art for its own sake. Contemplation can be a good and useful thing, for oneself as well as for others, and communities might leave a niche for it and be selected for doing this.

When it comes to the "meaning" of art, Davies favors an "original context theory", over a "modern" one: "The creation and appreciation of literature answers primarily to an interest [not] in works alone … [but] to works as the product of human authors" (149), and he argues that this still allows for multiple interpretations of works of art. He strongly defends the view that "the meaning of a literary work is fixed by factors holding at the time of the work's creation" (149), and he regards opposing postmodern theories as "counterintuitive" (161). Context theory is taken up again in another essay, where he discusses three theories of intentionalism: actual, hypothetical, and contextual. These turn out to be not as different from each other as has often been claimed (essay 11). They merely disagree over whether we should aim "to disclose what was meant, to consider what might have been meant, or to present the work in a manner that makes it most valuable as literature" (189). Davies argues that the third approach should be the preferred one. It even turns out that two or more conflicting interpretations can be true at the same time (essay 12). A literary work can have more than one meaning, and a sentence allows for more than one reading.

In the last chapter, Davies criticizes a version of Expression Theory that he takes to be its "ur-form". This theory "explains art's expressiveness as arising from artists' expressing their concurrent emotions of feelings in the production of art" (241-2). He says the view is widespread, but he thinks it is mistaken because "it is not common for most artists to work creatively under the duress of emotion" (242). The expressiveness of artworks does not reflect the artist's emotion as tears indicate sadness. Artists simply don't create their works in this way. Nevertheless, I must admit that on first blush it seemed to me that when looking at a painting by Vincent van Gogh and having just read his letters to his brother Theo, it will be difficult to avoid having the feeling that one sees things a bit the way he saw them and that one shares his emotions to some extent. Van Gogh certainly painted passionately, and his feelings are intertwined with his ways of seeing things. Feelings are complex and cannot be fully grasped by a simple word such as "sadness". But Davies offers a fine-tuned analysis of emotional expressiveness that sheds some light on what is actually going on. He distinguishes between three kinds of expressiveness: (1) unintentional, unreflected, and natural (primary) expressions; (2) intentional, reflected, and non-constitutive (secondary) expressions, an understanding of which presupposes independent knowledge of the agent's intentions and circumstances; and (3) expressions that rely on conventions and rituals (tertiary expressions of emotions). Davies then argues that the expressiveness of art is more of the second and third and much less of the first kind than we usually think. This indeed makes sense in the van Gogh case I introduced above, because there we have some additional knowledge through his letters. Besides the threefold distinction, this essay also offers several detailed discussions of how the expressiveness of art and the artists' own emotions must be distinguished in various cases and circumstances. Although van Gogh is "responsible" for the work's expressiveness, "appearances of primary expressions" do not need to "be primary expressions" (255).

All in all, this is a useful and stimulating book. The sixteen essays collected in it not only give "philosophical perspectives on art", as the title promises, but also offer sharp analyses that still form a unity.