Philosophical Perspectives on Depiction

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Catharine Abell and Katerina Bantinaki (eds.), Philosophical Perspectives on Depiction, Oxford University Press, 2010, 241pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199585960.

Reviewed by John Hyman, University of Oxford


Philosophical Perspectives on Depiction includes an introduction by the editors and eight previously unpublished articles by some of the best-known philosophers currently working in this area. It spans a broad range of topics and can fairly claim to represent the state of the art. I shall comment on the articles in turn, and then add some general comments.

In 'Pictorial Diversity', John Kulvicki investigates the diversity -- and in particular the limits on the diversity -- of what the marks on the surface of a picture can represent. As Kulvicki says, 'a graph could just as well chart changes in temperature over time as changes in pressure over time … while pictures do not readily admit of such reinterpretations.' He points out, for example, that there does not seem to be a workable 'interpretative scheme' that makes Van Gogh's painting of his bedroom a portrait of Gauguin's aunt. Kulvicki's explanation of this difference between graphs and pictures is that pictures have 'bare bones' content, which includes certain kinds of shape and colour properties, and that they 'instantiate their bare bones' content: in other words, they share these shape and colour properties with the objects and features they represent.

This is perhaps the clearest example in the collection of putting old wine -- in this case, a version of the resemblance theory of depiction -- in new bottles; but this is not objectionable as such. My main reservations about Kulvicki's argument concern the underexplained idea of an 'interpretative scheme'. What kind of thing is this supposed to be? Is it meant to generate pictorial T-sentences for every possible distribution of colours on a plane? Is our ability to identify what pictures represent meant to depend on knowledge of an interpretative scheme? Or is a scheme 'a theoretical representation of a practical ability', to borrow Michael Dummett's phrase? These and other such questions, familiar from debates in semantics in the 1970s and 1980s, are not even raised, let alone given plausible answers. However, the article is intelligent and assured, and although the idea of pictorial 'bare bones' content needs to be made -- and can be made -- precise by specifying the shape and colour properties it includes, it is a good way to explain how the shapes and colours on the surface of a picture constrain what it represents.

Dominic Lopes is interested in the way we refer to the things we see in pictures. When you point at a picture and say 'That's Albert', is this an ellipsis? Are you really saying 'That's [a picture of] Albert' or '[The person represented in] that [picture]'s Albert', where the demonstrative pronoun explicitly refers to the picture, rather than the prince? What limits can be placed on what we can demonstratively refer to? Must the object be 'present to the senses'? If so, how should this phrase be understood? Is seeing Albert in a picture sufficiently like seeing Albert in the flesh to justify the idea that the demonstrative is used in the same way in both cases?

Lopes's article, 'Picture This: Image-based Demonstratives', is mostly a discussion of the ideas about this problem defended in Mohan Matthen's book, Seeing, Doing and Knowing. Matthen connects the use of demonstratives with a feeling of 'presence' or 'readiness to hand'. He argues that we feel ready to reach out and touch an object we see face-to-face, but not an object in a picture, because we have two visual systems, a motion-guiding system and a descriptive system, and only in the first case does the motor-guiding system get engaged. Lopes accepts that the motion-guiding system is not normally engaged when we see what a picture represents. But he does not accept that demonstrative reference always needs this system to be active. He argues that the kind of experience we have when we see Albert in a picture, which only involves the descriptive visual system, is also capable of supporting demonstrative reference, albeit what he calls 'dependent demonstrative reference', following Paul Snowdon. So 'That is Albert' may be true just as it is.

Lopes is surely right to reject the idea that demonstrative reference is tied to a feeling of 'readiness to hand'. I can refer demonstratively to the sun, a thunderclap or a scent in the air, without feeling ready to reach out and touch it. And the idea of a feeling of 'presence' is too vague to be of use. To my mind, this suggests that postulating distinct visual systems and associated feelings isn't the way to sort out how demonstrative pronouns can be used. But Lopes leaves himself too little space to explore another route. Certainly, Snowdon's idea of 'dependent demonstrative reference' cannot be adopted without more careful argument than Lopes devotes to it. Lopes assumes that one can only refer demonstratively to an object represented in a picture if one knows one is looking at a picture, but this does not seem to be true. One can say 'That's a handsome violin' without failure of reference when the instrument is actually a viola. Presumably the same is true if one mistakes a paper maché model of a violin for a violin. And if it isn't also true when one is taken in by a trompe l'oeil painting of a violin, Lopes does not explain why.

Catharine Abell's contribution explores the epistemic status of photographs. Despite digital manipulation, hoaxes and other kinds of falsification, photographs seem to be regarded as more reliable sources of evidence than other kinds of pictures, for example by newspapers and courts of law. One might think that this is explained by the intrinsic differences between photographs and hand-made pictures: the different kinds of intention involved in making them, the fact that photographs are 'produced by largely mechanical means', the fact that every photograph is of a particular object that exists or existed at some time, and so on. But Abell argues persuasively that it is really due to the sophistication, standardization and reliability of modern photographic techniques. Photographs are not more reliable sources of evidence as such.

John Dilworth contributes a condensed overview of a theory of depiction proposed in earlier published work. It is, he claims, an advance on earlier theories, in particular Wollheim's, which he describes as confused 'from a cognitive science point of view'. Wollheim argues that a picture is a marked or 'differentiated' surface, which is designed to cause a distinctive kind of visual experience, which he calls 'seeing-in'. Seeing-in, he explains in Painting as an Art, is 'twofold', it has two aspects or components: 'I am visually aware of the surface I look at, and I discern something standing out in front of, or (in certain cases) receding behind, something else.' This kind of experience is not caused by pictures alone. It can also occur, for example, when we look at a stained wall. The element of purpose or intention is what distinguishes pictures from other marked surfaces that have the same effect.

Wollheim's definition of seeing-in is extremely vague, so vague that it doesn't enable us to explain the difference between a picture of a man and a picture of a sunflower or a church. We can say that we 'discern' a man or a sunflower standing out in front of something else, but this states the problem; it doesn't solve it. This is widely acknowledged to be one of the main weaknesses in Wollheim's theory. (See, for example, Budd 1992, Hyman 2006.) Dilworth is therefore entitled to describe it as 'inadequately analysed'; but he mistakenly argues that it is inconsistent with the fact that both aspects of the seeing-in experience 'must be derivable from viewings of the same physical design'. His own account of the kind of experience elicited by pictures is ingenious, but it fails to fill the gap in Wollheim's theory. He says that the inked lines on the surface of a drawing 'provide the respects in which the picture resembles a person seen face to face', but this remark is not elaborated or defended against the arguments that fill the copious literature attacking resemblance theories of depiction.

Katerina Bantinaki's article, 'Picture Perception as Twofold Experience', is a sympathetic study of Wollheim's idea of 'seeing-in', but the author makes it clear that it is one thing to 'improve our understanding of Wollheim's conception of pictorial experience' and another to defend the claim that depiction can be defined in terms of 'seeing-in'. Her ambitions are sensibly limited to the first. Bantinaki starts out from Aristotle's hylomorphism, the theory that individual substances are composed of matter and form. This 'dual aspect' theory of substances implies, she claims, that the perception of an individual substance also has two aspects, corresponding to the two aspects of the substance perceived. And if that is so, she points out, we can make sense of the 'twofold' character of 'seeing-in' by comparing it with mundane experiences of this kind. I doubt whether the relationship between matter and form is a good model for the relationship between the design on a picture's surface and what it represents -- isn't the relationship between the shape and meaning of a descriptive phrase a better match? -- but Bantinaki's article is of considerable interest and more wide-ranging than this brief comment suggests.

Robert Hopkins and Bence Nanay both write about an important and intriguing aspect of painting and drawing which Michael Podro explores in his book Depiction, namely, the way or ways in which features of the design on the surface of a picture can be 'recruited', as Podro puts it, to the scene the picture represents, as, for example, in a drawing in red chalk by Leonardo of a rearing horse, where the vigour of the drawing contributes to the manifest energy of the horse. Nanay's discussion is marred by his assumption that the flaws in Wollheim's theory of 'seeing-in' can be mended by distinguishing between perception and attention -- which they cannot -- but taken together these two essays and Lopes's discussion of the same idea in Sight and Sensibility, to which they both refer, add up to a particularly interesting development in the philosophy of depiction. The clarification of concepts can achieve substantial results here, as these authors show, and the temptation to rely on muddled or speculative ideas in cognitive science -- or even unmuddled and evidence-based ones -- has so far been resisted.

The topic of John Brown's absorbing article is, as the author puts it, the role played in our experience of pictorial art by 'seeing other things in pictures than … the authorized pictorial subject'. Another way of putting it is this. The great disparity between the materials employed by artists -- the pigment, the medium, the support -- and what they are used to represent means that paintings and drawings inevitably undermine or subvert their own representational purposes, to some extent. Brown's article explores the significance of this fact, both in cases where it is consciously exploited by artists and in cases where it is not. It also explores the limits on illusionism that painting cannot overcome, for example, because the spectator can look at a painting from different and from changing points of view. Brown argues that some current theories of depiction do not do justice to these phenomena, but this part of the article is too brief to be convincing. The great value of the article is that it draws attention to the ways in which artists can exploit the limits on the representational power of pictures, as well as those powers themselves, to achieve artistic effects.

As I said, the collection represents the state of the art. So, how are things going? What kind of state is the art in? I shall divide my answer into three parts.


The fundamental philosophical questions about pictures are how to define the concept of depiction and how to describe the distinctive kinds of artistic value embodied in pictorial art. The articles collected here confirm that no new ideas about the problem of definition have been introduced for many years, despite a rapid expansion of interest in the topic among philosophers and cognitive scientists. The reason for this, I think, is not a lack of acumen or imagination, but the fact that what is needed at this stage is a synthesis of familiar ideas, which are generally regarded -- and are presented in the editors' introduction to this volume -- as competitors.

For example, suppose we take as a starting-point the important distinction Goodman draws in Languages of Art between a picture that denotes a man, such as a portrait, and a man-picture, which need not denote anyone or anything at all. Goodman's nominalist philosophy of language prevented him from acknowledging that this is tantamount to distinguishing between the sense and reference of a picture, but there is no need for us to follow him in this. Suppose, next, focusing on sense, we use the idea of perspectival (or outline or occlusion) shape, which several philosophers have employed in different ways, to describe how the marks on the surface of a picture resemble the elements that comprise its sense -- that is, in Kulvicki's terminology, to describe how pictures 'instantiate their bare bones' content. Then suppose, still thinking about sense, we deploy the idea (defended by Schier and Lopes) that pictures engage the ability to recognize the kinds of objects that they represent to explain how perceiving the 'bare bones content' of a picture enables us to identify these objects. And finally, turning from sense to reference (from man-pictures to pictures that denote men), suppose we acknowledge the role played by the artist's intention in determining what a picture portrays or denotes. (As Wittgenstein put it in the Blue Book, 'An obvious, and correct, answer to the question "What makes a portrait the portrait of so-and-so?" is that it is the intention.')

This is meant as an example, although I happen to believe it is right. The main point is that we don't need to choose between Peirce, Goodman, Wollheim and Schier. None of them provided a satisfactory definition of depiction. But we can pick their views apart; and there are plausible ways of combining some of their ideas, while discarding others.

Cognitive science

On the whole, the relationship between the philosophy of art and cognitive science is not in particularly good shape. Most cognitive scientists interested in the visual arts have a very sketchy knowledge of philosophy in general and of the philosophy of art in particular; and some of the most widely-read among them -- Zeki and Ramachandran, for example -- know surprisingly little about art. (See Hyman 2010.) For their part, many philosophers are uncritical of ideas in cognitive science that seem to confirm their prior commitments or intuitions, and their assessment of competing ideas in the field tends to be superficial and unsystematic, if it happens at all.

The relationship between philosophy and cognitive science is an important theme in this volume. But the material that refers to cognitive science isn't the highlight of the collection. To some extent this reflects a tendency among philosophers to equate respect for science with deference to recent scientific ideas, however speculative and however coloured with philosophical ideas they would dismiss as muddled or jejune if they came across them in their colleagues' work. But it also reflects the absence of a properly thought-out view of the relationship between science and philosophy in general. This is something philosophers interested in depiction need as much as philosophers of physics and philosophers of mind, because of the extensive scientific literature about the perception of pictures. But there is little evidence of it in the philosophical literature about pictorial art.

Artistic value

The best articles in the collection are the last three. They are all concerned with the complex relationship between the surface and the content of a picture, and they are the only ones whose topics have a direct bearing on questions about artistic value. Perhaps the most interesting material is in this area because it is less thoroughly worked over and less stuck. In any case, there is surely room for more research which connects questions about the nature of pictorial art -- or specific pictorial media, such as photography -- with questions about its value as art. This, after all, is why Art and Illusion is a classic, despite the fact that 'the formulas [Gombrich] finds helpful in one chapter are not always consistent with the hypotheses he finds illuminating in the next', as J.J. Gibson tactfully remarked; and it is why Wollheim's work is still worth reading, despite the hollowness of the idea of seeing-in.


Budd, M. (1992), 'On Looking at a Picture', in Jim Hopkins & Anthony Savile (eds.), Psychoanalysis, Mind and Art. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Hyman, J. (2006), The Objective Eye. Chicago, Ill.: Chicago University Press.

Hyman, J. (2010), 'Art and Neuroscience', repr. in R.P. Frigg & M. Hunter (eds.), Beyond Mimesis and Convention, Boston Studies in the Philosophy of Science, 262. Dordrecht: Springer.