Philosophical Reflections on Medical Ethics

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Nafsika Athanassoulis (ed.), Philosophical Reflections on Medical Ethics, Palgrave Macmillan, 2005, 256pp., $79.95 (hbk), ISBN 1403945276.

Reviewed by Lynn Pasquerella, University of Rhode Island


Nafsika Athanassoulis provides a provocative collection of compelling essays devoted to the most controversial topics in contemporary bioethics.  Given the burgeoning interest in medical ethics, this volume seeks to showcase the contributions philosophers can make to identifying, clarifying and resolving issues currently at the forefront of both public discussion and private debate.

Progressing from dilemmas involving pre-conception to aid-in-dying, the book begins with Hallevard Lillehammer's discussion of a variety of reproductive scenarios involving decisions made in the absence of any identifiable person who will be benefited or harmed.  While according to person-involving principles, no harms or benefits can be accrued to such decisions, one response is that impartial, non-person-involving principles can be applied regarding quality of life in general. For instance, prospective parents concerned about bringing a child with Tay-Sachs into the world could evaluate a life filled with pain compared to one that is more pleasurable.  Thus, applying what Lillehammer refers to as "the beneficence principle" in pre-conception cases, it would be incumbent upon prospective parents to produce as much benefit as possible for any future child.

Lillehammer contends that such traditional responses to the non-identity problem, which focus exclusively on impartial ethical considerations, should be rejected on the grounds that they rely on an unnecessary bifurcation between person-involving principles and impartial, non-person-involving principles. The scenarios he introduces to illustrate his point culminate in the case of Sharon and Candace, a professionally successful deaf couple who choose a sperm donor with the goal of producing deaf children who will fit into their culture.  Their two children are each born with congenital deafness. Lillehammer argues that an application of purely impartial principles would lead many to the conclusion that Sharon and Candace's endeavoring to bring about deaf children was wrong. He contrasts this with a couple who rejects the idea of having a superhuman child with high intelligence in favor of a normal child.  In spite of the fact that the normal child may have a lesser quality of life, many would regard this as acceptable and condemn the idea of trying to have a superhuman child.  In both cases, the conclusions are consistent with the "no difference view" that it is no different to cause a disability in an existing person than to cause the existence of a disabled person.  Being normal is not considered a disability in society, unlike being deaf. However, Lillehammer eschews the "no difference view" and argues that in the case of Sharon and Candace, partial ethical considerations must be taken into account that emerge from the specific context of a socio-economically privileged couple immersed in the deaf culture. These considerations might justify purposely having a child with a disability, though a child without a disability could have been conceived. A conventional view of disabilities which denies this conclusion ought to be reconsidered, according to Lillehammer.  He admonishes against the notion that one form of life is better than another impartially considered, since judgments which appeal to impartial values may be tantamount to the generalization of partial values.

It would be interesting to apply Lillehammer's analysis to the recent non-conception case of a Washington couple who subjected their nine-year-old disabled daughter to surgery to remove her uterus, breast buds and appendix, and to doses of hormones to stunt her growth.  While the treatment may have provided some benefits for the child in terms of preventing bedsores and future menstrual discomfort, socio-economic considerations and social issues surrounding the care of the disabled seem to be as much at the center of this case as the direct benefit of the patient. Here, too, partial ethical considerations and social, economic and cultural factors took precedence over the resulting physical limitations that were placed on the child.

In an equally thought-provoking article, Stephen Wilkinson takes on the designer baby debate and provides a critical analysis of two main arguments against the creation of designer babies: (1) it instrumentalizes the child or embryo and (2) it denies the child the right to an open future. Designer babies result from pre-natal selection techniques or modifications of fetuses or embryos to produce children with or without specific features.  Wilkinson is concerned with whether there should be legal prohibitions and regulations against producing designer babies. He highlights three types of cases -- savior siblings, sex selection and designer disability -- and is careful to distinguish arguments against the act of creating designer babies and arguments against some of the means used to produce these babies, such as selective termination.

Before assessing the arguments against designer babies, Wilkinson sketches the main positive arguments in support of permitting them.  The first relies on the principle of procreative autonomy.  The second appeals to the principle of procreative beneficence, entailing that choosing the best possible children through technology is morally obligatory.

Arguments against designer babies based on instrumentalization appeal to the Kantian imperative that people be treated only as ends in themselves and never merely as means.  Whether or not Kant's dictum applies to gametes, embryos or fetuses, Wilkinson claims that treating such entities as means is not proscribed unless they are treated solely as means. The real challenge is in distinguishing designer babies from any other instance of procreation where the motivation is self-regarding, as in the desire to have an heir, carry on the family name, or meet religious or societal expectations.  People do not traditionally have children for the sake of the child.  In the end, Wilkinson views instrumentalization arguments as collapsing into child welfare arguments and, therefore, closely related to arguments appealing to a right to an open future.

In addressing the latter, Wilkinson returns to the problem of whether embryos are the sorts of entities that can possess rights, for to possess rights would imply personhood.  To circumvent this problem, he re-frames Feinberg's notion of a right to an open future in such a way that he avoids commitments regarding ontological status.  He then applies the revised principle to the cases raised at the outset and concludes that while designer disability may be problematic to justify based on open future arguments, sex selection and savior babies can be justified.

The next article, by Heather Draper, evaluates policies lifting gamete donor anonymity. Draper evaluates three main arguments in support of providing donor information: that there should be parity between adopted and donor people; that there is a right to know one's genetic origins; and that a complete genetic history is crucial for medical treatments.  She denies the force of arguments based on analogies between adoption and donation, and proceeds to consider arguments based on the notion that one's genetic relatedness yields a right of access to identifiable information.  Her position is that since genetic connection is not sufficient to establish parental responsibilities or the right to family life, donor people do not have the right to identifying information.
In "Compromise and Moral Complicity in the Embryonic Stem Cell Debate," Katrien Devolder and John Harris consider three different positions that countries take toward embryonic stem cell research and argue that stem cell research using embryonic stem cells is not only permissible, but may even be obligatory.

David Oderberg follows with an analysis of natural law theory applied to questions of genetic engineering.  He begins by detailing misinterpretations of the natural/unnatural distinction that have led to rejections of natural law theory.  He then attempts to explain the true basis of the theory and applies it to contemporary dilemmas involving cloning, designer babies, sex selection and stem cell research.  Oderberg's innovative approach makes meaningful contributions to contemporary literature, which has tended to ignore natural law theory.
Turning to problems involving the allocation of scarce medical resources, James Stacey Taylor defends the permissibility of markets to procure human transplant kidneys from live donors against claims that such a practice would compromise the autonomy of potential vendors. Taylor begins by elucidating the concept of autonomy and then proceeds to address arguments against allowing kidney procurement. He contends that respect for autonomy and concern for the well-being of the potential vendors speaks in favor of a legal, regulated, current market.  Nevertheless, in the process, Taylor raises other social and public policy reasons as to why such a market may not be morally permissible.

Piers Benn explores the role of conscience in medical ethics and considers whether it is wrong to deny the right of conscientious refusal to certain health care professionals. He does so by analyzing the logical structure and application of conscience and how it should be evaluated in the context of medicine and nursing.  In relation to conscience, Benn raises the question of whether it is wrong to do what one considers to be wrong, independently of whether the act itself is wrong.  Since one may be following one's conscience and yet acting wrongly, Benn argues that it is necessary but not sufficient to act in accordance with one's conscience.  He then discusses whether it is wrong to force decisions that go against an individual's conscience.  According to his central argument, (1) If it is wrong to act in ways that one considers to be wrong and (2) It is wrong to try to get someone to do what is wrong, then (3) It is wrong to try to get someone to do something that he considers wrong.

For Benn, conscientious objectors in medicine must follow dictates that are consistent with the goals of medicine.  Thus, it is unacceptable for a physician to refuse epidurals because he believes, on religious grounds, that women should suffer during childbirth.  This conflicts with professional principles of beneficence, nonmalificence and autonomy.   However, Benn's analysis applies to the highly publicized cases of conscientious objection involving pharmacists who refuse to fill prescriptions for "the morning after pill" or other contraceptive or abortive agents. Benn's arguments suggest it would be wrong to force such pharmacists to act against their consciences for two reasons.  First, it would be an assault on their integrity, and second, it goes against a desired pluralism in health care. Yet, what if one believes, as a matter of conscience, that one should try to get pharmacists to fill their clients' prescriptions regardless of their personal convictions?  Wouldn't it follow, in violation of Benn's conclusion, that it is not only permissible but incumbent upon one to try to get the pharmacist to do something she considers wrong because of one's own dictates of conscience?

Benn's analysis would be aided by richer arguments in support of the claim that it is wrong to do what one thinks is wrong, and a clear explanation of how this sheds light on whether there is a right of conscientious objection in medical practice, and, if so, the circumstances under which it should be respected.
In the final two articles, the scope of the right to autonomy in relation to assisted suicide and active euthanasia are addressed.  Athanassoulis argues that allowing patients to die by withholding treatment, in some instances, is morally equivalent to killing the patient, and may even be worse.  She compares Charlie, born with severe physical and mental disabilities compatible with life and who contracts pneumonia within the first few weeks, to Douglas, who has similar physical and mental handicaps, but does not contract pneumonia.  The question of treatment never arises with Douglas as it does with Charlie. Since Charlie and Douglas are similar in all relevant respects regarding the quality of their lives, neither treatment nor acts leading to death should be dependent upon luck.

Athanassoulis next compares two competent adults who want to die.  A ventilator-dependent woman is given the choice to refuse treatment, while the other, with an arguably lower quality of life but who is not ventilator-dependent, is not allowed aid-in-dying. Athanassoulis regards this as discrimination. Nevertheless, to count as a violation of principles of justice, equal cases need to be treated unequally. One might argue that Charlie and the ventilator-dependent patient are being allowed to die, whereas Douglas and the non-dependent patient are being killed. This leads back to the classic debate concerning whether there is a morally relevant distinction between killing and letting die.  Athanassoulis argues that in the case of Charlie and Douglas, where the act or omission is done in the best interest of the patient and with merciful motives, killing and letting die are morally equivalent.  She concludes that some patients are better off dead and that we should "let them die, assist them in dying or kill them" (196).

Ray Frey continues the debate about end-of-life issues by presenting a clear and compelling case against one set of arguments supporting legal proscriptions against physician-assisted suicide and voluntary active euthanasia. Since the early writings of James Rachels, Michael Tooley and Philippa Foot on whether there is a morally relevant distinction between active and passive euthanasia based on the killing and letting die distinction, the distinction between acts and omissions and the doctrine of double effect, there has been a great deal of philosophical literature devoted to the permissibility of active euthanasia and physician-assisted suicide.  Frey focuses on one aspect of the debate -- namely, treatment refusal and its permissibility if it is seen as a form of suicide.  He sets the stage for the debate by clarifying terms and drawing useful distinctions between active and passive euthanasia, voluntary, nonvoluntary and involuntary euthanasia, and euthanasia and physician assisted suicide. He goes on to criticize slippery slope arguments against those who voluntarily request assistance in dying before focusing on arguments related to treatment refusal.  Frey points out that in the United States, while laws against voluntary active euthanasia exist in all states and against assisted suicide in all but one state, there is a widely recognized right to refuse life-sustaining treatment.

Traditionally the courts have drawn a distinction between suicide and the refusal of life-sustaining treatment.  Still, there are those who regard such treatment refusal as tantamount to suicide.  Thus, Supreme Court Justice Antonin Scalia has argued that there is nothing distinctive about accepting death through the refusal of medical treatment as opposed to other forms of suicide.  Frey agrees. The conundrum he considers is this: if patient suicide is permissible in the form of treatment refusal, how can physician assisted suicide be impermissible?  It shouldn't be wrong to assist someone in doing what it is not wrong to do.  Frey argues that in both treatment refusal and physician assisted suicide, the physician is a cause of death, the intention may be the same, and patient consent is parallel.  He concludes that there is no morally significant distinction between treatment refusal and physician-assisted suicide and active voluntary euthanasia in the absence of any other moral factors.  Contrary to Scalia, however, Frey would expand patient autonomy to include physician-assisted suicide and active voluntary euthanasia.

Each chapter in this volume highlights the unique contributions philosophers can make in the realm of bioethics, and provides a model for philosophical analysis. Indeed, this book is essential reading for anyone interested in the vast range of complex ethical, social and legal issues at the center of contemporary medical ethics.