Philosophical Romanticism

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Nikolas Kompridis (ed.), Philosophical Romanticism, Routledge, 2006, 304pp., $33.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415256445.

Reviewed by Daniel Dahlstrom, Boston University


Philosophical romanticism, the editor states at the outset, is "a critical response to the Enlightenment interpretation of modernity," an endeavor by philosophy to make sense of its own historical conditions and forms of expressing itself. Identifying with the humanities and eschewing naturalism, philosophical romanticism is engaged in a normative critique of culture and itself at once. Its "primary task" is "to help enlarge the cultural conditions of intelligibility and possibility, and thereby open the horizon of the future" (4). Far from an artistic modernism, philosophical romanticism pursues this task by attaching normative primacy to receptivity and, in the process, significantly altering inherited notions of agency, the everyday, nature, and freedom. The formidable scope of this project -- to the credit of the contributors to this masterful volume -- invites critical questions at every turn, e.g., what counts as "intelligible," "possible," "normative" and why? does the project require that argument be subordinated to self-expression and its rhetorical demands and, if so, can an argument be given for doing so? do novelty -- or authenticity, openness, feeling, irony, wonder, presence (to mention only a few romantic themes elaborated in the volume) -- and 83 cents get you more than a cup of coffee? does it matter? how could we know that the opaque or inexplicable is inherently so? is the notion that human beings in the end are left to themselves, i.e., to their historical condition, more than a presumption and, indeed, is it compatible with the German romantic tradition?

This last question is significant since philosophical romanticism is supposed to reclaim German romanticism and idealism for our time. Several contributors (Frederick Beiser, J. M. Bernstein, Albert Borgmann, Richard Eldridge, Jane Kneller, and David Kolb) focus on ideas of seminal writers from that era. Others renew romanticism through meditation on the significance of the future and the past; for example, taking cues from Emerson, Stanley Cavell reflects on philosophy's difficulties with representing the future in the face of "a sense of exhaustion of human possibility"; Nikolas Kompridis explores the philosophical challenge of countenancing the normativity of the new, and Robert Pippin explains why Proust searches for lost time. Another set of contributions draws on Heideggerian themes, notably, Martin Seel on "letting oneself be determined," Hubert Dreyfus and Charles Spinosa on marginal practices, and Jeff Malpas on the wondrous opacity of the transparent.

Even from this brief précis, it should be apparent that the collection is eclectic. Nor are the contributions in lockstep with one another or in some cases, for that matter, with the editor's summaries of them. For example, Kompridis states that, for Beiser, romantic metaphysics failed to avoid the Spinozist trap of collapsing the individual into the world (13), yet one could hardly infer as much from Beiser's contribution, especially his concluding argument that the romantics develop a notion of freedom unthinkable for either Fichte or Spinoza. Kompridis also suggests that one implication of Dreyfus and Spinosa's piece is a "romantic image of dwelling in plural worlds" (15) but there is no evidence that Dreyfus and Spinosa construed this as "romantic" (they use the term pejoratively) and the very notion of a plurality of worlds conflicts with the monism (cosmic symmetry, homogeneity) that Beiser and Borgmann see in romantic thinking about nature. These discrepancies reflect the complicated business of subsuming the viewpoints expressed in the volume under the rubric of 'philosophical romanticism' (one of Morris Weitz's perennially debatable concepts, if there ever was one). Nevertheless, like the magical emergence of a medieval cathedral, the work of many different hands and generations, philosophical romanticism takes on a definite, if not always definable shape in this collection of remarkable essays, each of which -- along with the editor's valuable introduction -- deserves and rewards careful reading.

In an insightful essay premised on the idea that modern subjectivity's fate is to face or evade the task of combining autonomous selfhood and social identity, Eldridge submits that Goethe's Werther, a victim of "self-proclaimed exceptionalism," epitomizes the evasion (104). (An aside: Werther's narcissism notwithstanding, addressing "God directly and intimately, presuming to be his particular and special son" hardly implies salvation to the exclusion of others, as Eldridge suggests). Eldridge discusses how Wittgenstein, no less than Goethe, experiences what Werther does ("genius or suicide"), without following his suicidal path. Eldridge's account is compelling, but it leaves one wondering whose subjectivity is "romantic" (Werther's or Wittgenstein/Goethe's or both?) and why, i.e., on what conception of the 'romantic'. Eldridge characterizes Wittgenstein's version of the dilemma in terms of being caught between two anxieties: the anxiety of expressibility (as it dawns on a person that she can only express what is not uniquely hers, that "the only routes of expression are already laid down in surrounding practice") and inexpressibility (as it dawns on her that she cannot express "whatever-it-is in the ordinary"). If the dilemma seems contrived, it is perhaps because Eldridge is arguing that Wittgenstein, again like Goethe, avoids Werther's fate by the act of writing, achieving at once a social identity and some distance from the anxieties of the subject.

This conclusion provides a perfect segue to Pippin's scintillating interpretation of Proust's anxiety about failing to become who he is as a writer -- as well as a lover, social entity, and the narrator of Remembrance of Things Past. What is presumably romantic about Proust's work is its intense disillusionment with the present (present beliefs about oneself, the present rapid and disorienting social change, present and thus all too familiar, habitual loves), the search for lost time that this very disillusionment calls for, and the celebration of art (suitably understood) as the only means of recovering that lost time and becoming who we are. Pippin accordingly contends that the novel, in addition to recounting those disappointments, shows a capacity for achieving independence while negotiating social dependence. Marcel in fact becomes a writer but precisely by giving up Platonic aspirations for art as an attempt to rescue truth from "the wholly temporal human world" (130). Nor does retrospection simply replace introspection; Marcel becomes who he is only by acting a certain way, i.e., without the pretension of being in control, "and even then what he intended to do and what he did are both subjects for much uncertain retrospective contestation" (133).

Several essays, as noted, treat specific themes from German romanticists and idealists. From Hegel's account of the process of self-becoming and parallel (albeit differently oriented) notions in Deleuze, Kolb develops an impressive model of authentic normative formation, one that critically compares old with new in terms of "authenticity to a process rather than a patrimony" (73). Acknowledging Hegel's limitations, Kolb stresses that the authenticity in question has teeth precisely because it countenances an endless, nonlinear process, expanding by juxtapositions ("country-rap"). This emphasis links Kolb's proposal with the convincing arguments by Kneller and Rush for the "open-ended," distinctively Kantian -- as opposed to Fichtean -- character of Novalis' thinking (189, 211). While Kneller also excavates the roots of Novalis' critical reaction to Fichte in Kant's own romanticism, Rush elaborates Schlegel's modifications of Novalis' views in terms of the concept of irony. Emphasizing irony's dialectical character, Rush concludes with a judicious sketch of reasons to question Hegel's criticisms of romantic irony as a Fichtean legacy.

Among the articles on German romantics and idealists, there are valuable and provocative differences in interpretation. For example, Bernstein's article offsets Kneller's and Rush's readings of the positive prospects of romanticism. Bernstein takes his bearings from the modern view that artworks have the capacity to bind meaning and matter, thereby suspending the duality of scientific and moral rationality, but precisely by heeding the constraints of material mediums. He contends that this promise of aesthetic reason is undone by Jena romanticism, with its "claim for the universality of poesy, as premised on the arbitrariness of the linguistic sign" (146). By regarding linguistic arts as products of a freedom intrinsically incommensurable with material objectivity ("the sublimity of modern freedom," as Bernstein dubs it) and as sources of the conditions of their own normative possibility, Schlegel is said to develop an "exemplary aesthetic denial of the aesthetic" (148) -- a thesis that Bernstein drives home with critical reviews of two anti-aesthetic defenses of romanticism: De Man's essay on irony and Blanchot's treatment of the romantic fragment.

Bernstein makes a potent case that romanticism, in what amounts to a philosophical disenfranchisement of art, systematically disqualifies the aesthetic packed into Virgil's "Ut pictura poesis." In need of clarification, however, are his statements both that the romantics took the enchantment of nature for granted (147) and that "[Schlegel's] conception of freedom presupposes the disenchantment of nature" (170 n. 26), especially given his claim that Schlegel's aesthetic (or "anti-aesthetic") contradicts his conception of nature. By contrast (prima facie at least), Beiser argues for the coherence of romantic metaphysics, namely, its joining of Fichtean idealism and Spinozistic naturalism, when placed "in the context of its underlying organic concept of nature" (218). After elaborating romantics' discontent with Fichte's subjectivist account of the subject-object identity and Schelling's motivations (crises in physiology and physics) for generalizing Kant's concept of the organic to nature as a whole, Beiser demonstrates how the romantics effectively "organicized" Spinoza's monism such that nature could be viewed in (suitably qualified) idealistic and realistic ways at once (227ff). Romantic metaphysics places humanity and nature in a reciprocal relationship where each exists for the sake of the other, and Beiser completes his account by indicating the implications of romantic metaphysics for conceptions of knowing and freedom. Precluded from accepting Kantian and Fichtean senses of freedom, the romantics argue that true freedom consists in participating in the whole which acts "according to the necessity of its own nature alone" (234).

In "Broken Symmetries: The Romantic Search for a Moral Cosmology," Borgmann begins by stating the "cosmological predicament" for the romantics: the fact that the nature disclosed by modern science and commercially transformed by machinery is inadequate to human striving. Borgmann's first step is to identify roots of the predicament by giving unconventional interpretations of the thinking of Kant and Goethe. After noting how Kant's early "systematic moral cosmology" gives way to a conception of cosmological research devoid of moral pretensions, Borgmann argues that Kant's mature metaphysical-dynamical hypothesis is motivated, not only by the empirical indiscernibleness of atomic impenetrability (supposed by a mechanical-mathematical explanation), but also by the failure of that explanation to capture "the living forces of things" (244). However, since Kant's hypothesis serves only to refute Newtonian atomism, "Kant left the living and commanding presence of reality philosophically unaccounted for" (245). Goethe fares better in this regard but not so much by disputing Newtonian optics directly (in the Farbenlehre) as in focusing (in Elective Affinities) on the force of contingency and its capacity to heighten the concrete presence of reality in human lives. Cognizant of the need to reconcile Kantian lawfulness and Goethean presence but incapable of doing so, Schelling furnishes "a variety of instructive explorations" (251), such as limiting science's significance by casting it instrumentally, giving alternative accounts of forces and organisms, and stressing the complementarity of science and art. Exploiting this last suggestion, Borgmann argues trenchantly for the interdependent character of that complementarity.

In the volume's penultimate entry, Dreyfus and Spinosa contend that, despite some appearances to the contrary, Heidegger is neither a "nostalgic romantic" nor akin to later romantics who focus on loss and destruction, itself a technological reaction to technology, of a piece with the project of mastering--and thereby succumbing--to it. The problem for Heidegger, Dreyfus and Spinosa submit (somewhat precipitously, in my view), is not so much the destruction of nature and culture or a self-indulgent consumerism as it is the exclusive hold of a certain style of practices of revealing people and things, practices of technicity that inhibit our openness to those people and things, while suppressing alternatives. The key to technicity's dominance is the endless transformability of people and things, both construed as part of a standing-reserve, reserved for no one in particular. The very antithesis of anything conspiratorial, the metaphysical shroud of modern technology prevails over everything with the single, amoral dictate of making the most of possibilities. In Dreyfus and Spinosa's apt formulation: "We thus become part of a system that no one directs but which moves towards the total mobilization and enhancement of all beings, even us" (270). The situation is not hopeless. Japanese culture allegedly attests to the possibility of using technology without taking over its understanding of being, and the history of Western thinking shows that this understanding, like other understandings of being, is not inevitable but received. Beyond recognizing technicity for what it is, namely, a relative, historical understanding of being, Heidegger's positive response to technology consists in, not simply accepting the mystery of the gift of this understanding, but also protecting "endangered species of practices," engaging in marginal ("focal") practices that resist optimization. After sketching Heidegger's account of these practices, centered around some saving power of an everyday thing, in terms of the four elements: earth, sky, mortals, divinities, Dreyfus and Spinosa elaborate how the account applies significantly to use of a highway bridge or computer. Though use of them absents us from local worlds, it can, by the same token, also make us sensitive to their multiplicity so long as we recognize that such use discloses only one possible world and "we maintain skills for disclosing other kinds of local worlds" (279). Dreyfus and Spinosa conclude by noting that Heidegger in a late seminar abandoned the ontological difference, reflecting his appreciation of the impediment that a unified understanding of being presents to "the gathering of local worlds" (279). It warrants mentioning that Heidegger takes issue with the ontological difference already in the Beiträge (1936-38).

Differentiating wonder from puzzlement and curiosity, Malpas ("Beginning in Wonder, Placing the Origin of Thinking") makes the case that wonder is not simply a psychological impetus but the first principle and measure of philosophy, its paradoxical origin and limit. While wonder may arise from the extraordinary, it is the extraordinariness of the ordinary (the opacity of ordinary transparency), Malpas submits, that instills wonder "at its most basic" (286). Malpas likens this wonder to the experience of being "caught up" in a work of art and the world it discloses, a prototype of the disabling and disruptive, properly philosophical wonder, not at the world in general, but at "the world in its specificity," at the very fact of something's existing or, in Heidegger's terms, "the twofoldness of what is present and presence" (289). Malpas claims that things' sheer presence or appearance, together with "our 'being there,'" the strangeness of which provokes wonder, not only provokes but also resists explanation (291). Wonder, so conceived, rules out an exclusive pursuit of complete explanation but also a skepticism or relativism about our capacity to make things transparent. Instead it implies for Malpas that philosophy address itself, following Heidegger's model, to the interplay of opacity and transparency.