Philosophical Theology and Christian Doctrine

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Brian Hebblethwaite, Philosophical Theology and Christian Doctrine, Blackwell Publishing, 2005, 192pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0631211527.

Reviewed by Brian Davies, Fordham University


This book is a contribution to the series Exploring the Philosophy of Religion edited by Michael L. Peterson. The aim of this series is to deal with topics in philosophy of religion so as to expound and discuss literature relevant to them. The envisioned audience, to quote Peterson's manifesto, is 'serious undergraduates, graduate students, divinity and theology students, professional philosophers, and even thoughtful, educated lay persons' (p.ix). Brian Hebblethwaite's particular concern is 'to survey and comment on recent work by Anglo-American philosophers of religion in the analytic tradition on the doctrines of the Christian creed' (p.xi). Following chapters on philosophy of religion and theology, and on revelation, he therefore turns to belief in creation, the Incarnation, the Trinity, matters concerning human salvation, and life after death. In a concluding chapter Hebblethwaite rounds off his volume by turning to what he calls 'Other Themes in Christian Doctrine'. These are: the church, the sacraments, the philosophy of worship, and 'the doctrine of providence'.

Hebblethwaite, a canon of the Church of England and Fellow of Queen's College, Cambridge, is clearly in favor of what he takes to be Christian doctrine. But he does not write so as to seem to be preaching only to the choir. He repeatedly reiterates the importance of impartial philosophical debate and seems at pains to note the existence of some wildly divergent opinions. Philosophy, he maintains, can be useful to theology. It has, he thinks, been especially helpful in recent years as philosophers have turned to specifically doctrinal questions (rather than devoting all their time to, for example, arguments for the existence of God). Hebblethwaite is aware that there are theologians who continue to resist incursions by philosophers into strictly theological territory. In a spirit of peace-making, however, he encourages both philosophers and theologians to hear each other out and to benefit from what each have to say. 'A major purpose of this book', he writes, 'is to encourage both sides to respect each other and learn from each other' (p.5). Is God beyond human understanding? Without wishing to deny the incomprehensibility of God, Hebblethwaite urges that Christians do not speak a private language and that what they say can be regarded as open to philosophical investigation and development. Should philosophy ignore the key teachings of Christianity? Without claiming that all of these are subject to philosophical demonstration, Hebblethwaite suggests that they provide food for philosophical thought and that they can all be profitably considered philosophically. Christian doctrines, he observes, 'are the result of centuries of reflection and debate by bishops and teachers committed to the Christian faith and schooled in the Hebrew and Christian scriptures' (p.7). It does not however follow, Hebblethwaite adds, that they cannot 'be pondered and examined critically by anyone interested in questions of meaning and truth. Up to a point, at least, they can be considered hypothetically and their inner rationale explored' (p.7). 'What is required', says Hebblethwaite, 'is a combination of open-mindedness, genuine sympathy, and intellectual rigour … Christian theologians have nothing to fear, and everything to gain, from allowing their subject matter to be discussed and scrutinized in such an open context' (p.8). Readers should note, however, that Hebblethwaite sees good philosophical sense to be coming from analytic rather than other styles of philosophy. He is fairly dismissive of what is sometimes called 'continental philosophy'. In this he detects 'generalizations' which 'become a kind of device for inhibiting serious reflection on the metaphysical implications of theism and of Christian doctrine, thus preventing us from learning anything from the philosophers and traditions so easily dismissed' (p.10). One of Hebblethwaite's models as a philosopher-theologian is Basil Mitchell.

What are Hebblethwaite's preferred positions when it comes to the philosophy of Christian doctrine? To begin with, he endorses a notion of creation ex nihilo which, he thinks, can be defended whether or not the world ever began to exist (pp.38 ff). Yet he does not favor the suggestion that God, as Aquinas put it, operates in all creaturely operations (p.40) -- a view which Hebblethwaite curiously refers to as 'occasionalism'.

When it comes to divine mutability and non-temporality, Hebblethwaite sides for the claim that God is both changeable and temporal (pp.44ff et passim). He says, for example, that 'the strengths of process theology lie in the way in which it provides a philosophical underpinning of the biblical idea of God, one which reckons, much more than classical theism does, with the activity and involvement of God, and with the fundamental idea of the interactive suffering of God' (p.47).

When it comes to the Incarnation, Hebblethwaite favors what he takes to be traditional views. He is, for example, no fan of books like the famous/infamous The Myth of God Incarnate (published in 1977 and edited by John Hick, who gets bad marks at various stages in Hebblethwaite's book). Hebblethwaite does, however, seem to endorse the suggestion that there are a priori reasons for believing that God is somehow more than one. 'The individual is something of an abstraction', he writes. 'Maximal greatness cannot be modelled on such abstraction. It must include, essentially, interpersonal relation' (p.79). Hebblethwaite also speaks up for what he calls 'social trinitarianism' (pp.83 ff). Many of his readers will find him here effectively to be favoring tritheism, though Hebblethwaite denies that this is what he (and others with whom he agrees) are doing. 'Even in the human world', he asserts, 'it can be shown that communion is more basic than the individual, and that persons in relation, not least in intense loving and mystical communion, glimpse or achieve a unity that transcends their separateness' (p.88). 'The trinitarian distinctions and relations', Hebblethwaite tells us, 'are internal to the Ultimate. There are not, and could not be, three ultimates, externally related' (p.87).

On issues to do with salvation, Hebblethwaite (distancing himself from what he calls 'subjective' theories of the Atonement), opts for an account which, he thinks, allows us to give weight both to the demands of justice and to the notion of forgiveness (Chapter 6). When it comes to life after death, Hebblethwaite (distancing himself from authors such as D.Z. Phillips) finds it best to start thinking in terms of some kind of mind-body dualism. 'It is', he says, 'not unreasonable to think of the subject [sic] as a spiritual substance, at present inextricably linked to a growing organism but not identifiable with it. It is this that leads us to retain the idea of the soul' (p.117). When it comes to the final happiness of all people, Hebblethwaite seems to favor a doctrine of universal salvation. 'It is', he notes, 'hard not to agree with [Marilyn] Adams that [Eleonore] Stump's and [Richard] Swinburne's views of the nature of eternal loss are no more compatible with the goodness and love of God than is the traditional doctrine of everlasting punishment' (p.125).

Is Hebblethwaite's book a good one? It certainly summarizes a lot of literature in a polite and balanced way. Yet it is not, I think, likely to prove useful to anyone in particular. It reads very much like a set of briefly annotated book notes cobbled together so as to make up a volume. So, undergraduate (or even graduate) students of philosophy and theology shall be likely to find themselves somewhat bewildered as Hebblethwaite cites names and summarizes the work of a large number of authors (in, I might add, a rather dull way). And professional philosophers and theologians shall be frustrated by the quick way in which Hebblethwaite comes to those positive conclusions that he seems most concerned to endorse. At no point does Hebblethwaite engage in the kind of argumentation that is needed properly to substantiate positions that he favors. He does not indulge in sustained and detailed discussions of any of the authors whose views he summarizes (especially those defending positions different from his own). His conclusions may be right, but he does not do enough to show that they are. He moves far too quickly. Given the series in which his book appears, and given the word length that must have been assigned to him, one should perhaps (as I am) be inclined to be indulgent with Hebblethwaite here. It remains, though, that Philosophical Theology and Christian Doctrine seems (at least to me) to be an unhelpful volume, one with no real audience likely to benefit from it or to want to engage with it in print.

Its contents do, however, suggest that Hebblethwaite might have in him a volume likely to interest contemporary philosophical theologians. Many of the authors to whom he alludes are ones writing only within the last thirty years or so, but he also frequently (very frequently, and very favorably) refers to the work of Austin Farrer (1904-1968), an Anglican priest and, at the time of his death, Warden of Keble College, Oxford. I believe that Farrer's books (some of them posthumously published as volumes of sermons) are now mostly out of print, but their content is rich, and perhaps we may hope that Brian Hebblethwaite shall some day offer us a detailed (and currently long overdue) discussion of his thought -- thought to which Hebblethwaite seems to be particularly indebted.