Philosophies of Difference: A Critical Introduction to Non-Philosophy

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François Laruelle, Philosophies of Difference: A Critical Introduction to Non-Philosophy, Rocco Gangle (tr.), Continuum, 2010, 228pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780826436634

Reviewed by Graham Harman, American University in Cairo


François Laruelle has been a prolific author of philosophical books since the 1970s. Born in the same year as the already famous Alain Badiou (1937), he is no longer young. But while Laruelle already has a sizable following of Anglophone readers who discovered him in the original French, it took until 2010 for this first book-length work to appear in English. The book is skillfully translated and introduced by Rocco Gangle, who does good work in making Laruelle available to a wider readership, quite apart from the objections I will register to the style and content of the book.

Laruelle's general term for his work is "non-philosophy," and the implicit historical claim is as radical as it sounds. Just as Heidegger reads two millennia of predecessors as being trapped in metaphysics, Laruelle views his forerunners as the servants of "philosophy," which his own non-philosophy aims to outstrip. In this respect, Laruelle belongs to a familiar tradition of "end of philosophy" proclamations.

Before entering into the details of the book, it is worthwhile to reflect on an even more obvious historical series in which Laruelle is now inserted. In some quarters there is a tendency to mock the endless succession of new French philosophers. The period from 1945 to 1989 witnessed the rise and partial eclipse of such figures and movements as Merleau-Ponty, existentialism, structuralism, Derrida, and Foucault. From the mid-1990s Deleuze was the new golden horse, and with the turn of the century Badiou assumed the mantle of the latest hero of Parisian thought.

The candidacy of Laruelle comes late in the day, with Anglophone readers already intrigued by the much younger Meillassoux (b. 1967), and with even more youthful figures already on the horizon. In the eyes of detractors, this long succession of names is as frivolous as a runway fashion show, and suffices to prove that French philosophy offers more a collection of transient new perfumes than stages on the road of rigorous thinking.

This verdict is exaggerated, but follows naturally from the very different views of philosophy held by the analytic and continental traditions, whose supposed unification is often prematurely declared. The continued dissonance of these traditions is best understood through the marvelous 1894 lecture "The Four Phases of Philosophy and its Current State,"[1] written and delivered in typically acerbic fashion by Franz Brentano. In this lecture Brentano notes that in some respects philosophy is like the sciences, showing a largely constant development, but in other respects is more like the fine arts, with their alternating periods of ripeness and decay.[2] Analytic readers of this lecture, bolstered by Brentano's youthful claim that the method of philosophy is the same as that of the natural sciences, downplay or ignore the "fine arts" side of the equation, though Brentano himself makes no effort to erase it.

Just as the arts advance more through a punctuated series of epoch-making figures than through the collective piecework of progress-in-detail (à la Kuhnian "normal science"), continental philosophy is committed to a model in which the history of philosophy consists of the rise and fall of major figures. Its continuing series of new star thinkers is not a display of fashion models, but of candidates for durable importance -- and here as everywhere else, not all candidates succeed. The fact that these candidate figures have mostly been French for the past seventy years is not a sign of deluded Francophilia, but of a long yet temporary historical phase in which frenetic activity in Paris has been matched by an ebbing trickle of original continental thinkers from the German-speaking world, and the failure so far of important new capitals to emerge.

It is in this spirit that we must assess Laruelle's Philosophies of Difference, since the unstated context of the book is that we are being asked to consider Laruelle as one of the formidable new French thinkers -- a candidate for lasting importance to philosophy. It is a rigorous test that few authors endure for long, but one from which his admirers cannot spare him.

Following a helpful Translator's Introduction by Gangle, the book proper begins with Laruelle's prefatory "Instructions for Use." Whereas nineteenth-century philosophy was obsessed with history and dialectic, the key terms in the twentieth century are "difference" and "finitude." Difference is exemplified in the works of Nietzsche and Deleuze. But a conjunction of difference and finitude can be found in Heidegger and Derrida, who represent respectively the "Greco-Roman" and "Judaic" experiences of difference. These historical remarks pave the way for some rather sweeping systematic claims by Laruelle. He proposes a "science" (in later books termed "non-philosophy") that will deliver us from philosophy, which always functions as an "absolute forgetting." Instead of philosophy we will arrive at something called the "Vision-in-One," with the One serving as "the most immanent and most real radical unity of man and knowledge" (xvii).

Chapter 1 bears the simple title "Introduction." The dominant theme of twentieth-century philosophy is "difference," not "being." Laruelle disowns this tradition of difference, but claims that it sets the table for his own theory. A key point is that difference functions as both "syntax" and "reality." Difference as syntax is found in those philosophies where beings are reciprocally determined without remainder. Laruelle reads both Nietzsche and Deleuze as anti-realists of this sort. Difference as reality is found in Heideggerian finitude, where something always withdraws behind the immanent play of forces in the world. In both cases, difference addresses the underlying problem of the Greco-Occidental tradition: the strife of contraries within a One. Western philosophy is all about mixtures, but Laruelle recommends that we abandon philosophy in favor of a more immediate and non-idealist experience of the One.

Chapter 2 is entitled "Syntax of Difference." Even in Heidegger, the great opponent of immanence, we find a reversible relation in which opposite terms such as withdrawal and clearing are mutually intertwined. Heidegger thereby remains trapped in a "transcendental syntax." For while he always grants privilege to the deeper of the two terms in his oppositions, the deeper term is meaningful only through its inscription in the accessible surface of the world. This can be seen in Heidegger's frequent use of tautologies such as "language speaks," in which nothing remains as a withdrawn noun outside its concrete actions. For Laruelle, the passage to the transcendental level is an invariant of all philosophy, which remains forever trapped in an immanent duel of opposites.

The title of Chapter 3 is "Reality of Difference." Whereas the previous chapter showed that all Greco-Occidental philosophy is enveloped in a syntax of mutually dependent terms, Laruelle now backtracks and makes partial alliance with Heidegger against Nietzsche. Heidegger does not oppose Kant's thing-in-itself, but Nietzsche banishes finitude in favor of an "auto-position" of beings, such that they are dependent on nothing deeper than themselves. While both Nietzsche and Deleuze remain dependent on the mutual circularity of co-dependent terms, Heidegger insists that something withdraws behind worldly immanence. Idealists such as Hegel are wrong to treat finitude as a mere symptom of common sense, and Heidegger is right to turn finitude into a principle of realism. Nonetheless, in his ontological difference we have an "imbrication" in which Being needs beings. Heidegger failed to demonstrate that the submission of difference to "the Other" is irreversible, since being and beings remain too mutually dependent.

Chapter 4, "Hegel and Heidegger," unfolds exactly as expected. At this stage of the book Laruelle insists rather violently on the difference between these figures, as seen from the magnificent section title: "Systematic Dissolution of the Resemblances of Hegel and Heidegger." Hegel's approach is futile, since he remains entirely within the syntax of mutually dependent terms and merely converts the standard Greco-Occidental philosophy into a play of mirrors. Hegelians want to subsume Heideggerian withdrawal into the "logic of essence," but the difference of finitude from Hegel's system is not a specific difference and thus cannot be subsumed by the dialectic. Whoever attempts to find a "real" outside Hegel will always be accused of a relapse into Kantianism, but Heidegger purifies Kant's thing-in-itself of any epistemological sense, giving us a radically non-relational concept of difference. Nietzsche, like Hegel, remains an idealist, giving us a purely differential concept of force in which Will to Power is effected only in its relations.

Chapter 5, "Derrida," is possibly the most disappointing in the book. Although Laruelle's prose is often harder to follow than Derrida's own, his generally sober academic tone leads one to anticipate a good faith effort to translate Derrida into terms more acceptable to his detractors. Instead, the chapter wanders through a stylistically derivative Derridaland, hardly bothering to address the unconverted. We stand helpless before such remarks as: "If not Deconstruction's plane of consistency, after the fashion of the Nietzschean Eternal Return, nonetheless a plane of dehiscence: a Judaic plane, no doubt, but still a plane and so even if it denies itself as such." (122) After many pages in this same spirit, Laruelle's central claim about Derrida finally emerges from the mist. Unlike Heidegger, Derrida does not oppose the realm of presence (or logos) with a withdrawn Other. Instead, he opposes any particular logos with logos viewed as an infinite flux. Instead of going deeper than immanence, Derrida disrupts it laterally by showing the instability of its configurations, though he remains strangely dependent on absolute alterity to enable cuts in the flux. Laruelle tells us repeatedly that this is a "Judaic" strategy, though one that ultimately works in favor of the purely Greek concept of difference.

In Chapter 6, "Critique of Difference," Laruelle shifts toward a positive development of his own theories, and does not wait long to communicate his audacity. He defends a non-Greek conception of the One, considered as a radically immanent unity. The real is not withdrawn, but is so immediately evident that only philosophy can forget it. Despite the accessibility of the One, it is not an idea, and this supposedly differentiates it from the One of Neo-Platonism and makes it something new in the history of thought. Immediate contact with the One is the irreducible "mystic" condition for every philosophy -- but not a "mystical" condition, since no superior form of initiation or spiritual praxis is required. While philosophy imagines that its numerous pairs of opposite terms are riddled with complexity and paradox, it is philosophy itself that creates this confusion.

Chapter 7 is entitled "Theory of Philosophical Decision." Its final statement on what is wrong with philosophy is not altogether clear. All philosophy is based on decision, which has a "hallucinatory" character. Decision is a process in which a cut is made in the empirical realm according to some idealizing law. This creates a new sort of gap, different from that between empirical or ideal, in which the law is taken for real. But in the light of the One, such decisions are marked by a profound contingency that Laruelle calls the "(non-) One." The One is neither decidable nor determinable. Nothing allows us to choose between Hegel, Heidegger, and Nietzsche or between Deleuze and Derrida, since all are prisoners of a certain game, ignorant of the immediate One. Laruelle's earlier "systematic dissolution of the resemblances of Hegel and Heidegger" fades back into an indifferent resemblance. All philosophical decisions are marked by an equal absurdity. The One is nothing less than a "determination in the last instance," the immediately immanent basis for all philosophical decision.

Earlier I said that the appearance of this book in English is not just the publication of a set of arguments about philosophies of difference. Implicitly it is also a trial balloon to test the reception of Laruelle in the Anglophone world, to see if he might join the recent Supreme Court of French thinkers from Derrida and Foucault through Deleuze and Badiou.

As I see it, there are several grave obstacles to this aspiration. The first is Laruelle's prose style, which is generally abominable. The following passage is not the worst in the book, but merely typical among the bad ones: "This is an immediacy alien -- at least in principle or in its intention -- to the mediation of scission, of nothingness, of transcendence inasmuch as one would understand these as 'particular' and transcendent operations: it suffers these rather, and is constrained to uniting itself to them." (87) The sentence is certainly not "meaningless." Taken in context, its meaning is clear enough -- eventually, after some minutes of labor. But to compile the chapter summaries above was never a pleasurable experience for this reviewer, and was often a downright painful one. Laruelle will get away with it only if he can prove that the payoff is sufficient to warrant the effort.

The second obstacle is the remarkable arrogance with which Laruelle's theory is presented. Badiou raised eyebrows when, in his Author's Preface to the English version of Being and Event, he told us that this is a great book destined to be read throughout the centuries. But at least Badiou made room for numerous peers in the kingdom: authors of other great past and future books destined to be read alongside his own. Laruelle goes immeasurably further, telling us that given his model of the One it is useless to make distinctions among the blur of philosophies melting Hegel and Heidegger together with Nietzsche, Deleuze, and Derrida. Nor is he merely belittling this relatively recent list of names: all philosophy, he says, falls into "decision" while overlooking the immanent One that is obvious to everyone but philosophers. Nor is Laruelle always polite in this claim. Shifting from the tone of a mystic to that of a misanthropic Lex Luthor or Grand Moff Tarkin, Laruelle refers to past philosophers as "larvae," whose "hesitations . . . stumblings . . . skiddings" are designed "to prove to themselves that they still exist when in truth they exist only as fleeting larvae on the earth." (179) If there is a more bizarre passage in recent philosophy, or a more twisted sentiment, it is unknown to me.

But even arrogance is forgiven when it comes from the great illuminators. And here we reach the third and most serious obstacle to the reception of Laruelle's work. For it is not at all clear that his central insight is of value. First, it can be questioned whether we really have a direct experience of the One at all -- yet this is the whole foundation of Laruelle's often extreme claims. Second, he gives no proof for the assertion that his is a different sense of the One from that of the neo-Platonic philosophers. And finally, even if Laruelle can handle these objections: so what? What good would it do to install an opposition between the One as a unilateral "determination in the last instance" and the cosmos of difference where the "larvae" become entangled in their pointless games? Laruelle's One is not the night, but the daylight in which all cows are black.

[1] The lecture is contained as an appendix in Balázs M. Mezei and Barry Smith, The Four Phases of Philosophy (Amsterdam: Rodopi, 1998), translated from the German by Mezei and Smith themselves.

[2] Ibid., p. 85.