Philosophy After Deleuze

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Joe Hughes, Philosophy After Deleuze, Bloomsbury, 2012, 174pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441195166.

Reviewed by James Williams, University of Dundee


Gilles Deleuze's philosophy poses deep challenges for educators and students in mass markets. The nature of the problem is captured well in his philosophy of education. For Deleuze, learning is an apprenticeship to signs. This is an individual and experimental way to learn, played out between at least two living beings as they create together in signs. The images for a sense of this doctrine are in the beginnings of a dance, as we tentatively accord our bodies searching for common indices in music and bodies, or in the first move and counter-gesture of an erotic encounter, or when strangers are thrown together by an unwanted task, so how are we going to get out of this lift, and what if he doesn't stop sobbing . . . ?

The representations to relegate are of Hughes' the lectern and the notebook, or the textbook and test, where knowledge is replicated from origin to receptive surface, or in the disciplining of bodies and minds to make them ripe for unified control and marketing, or in the rhetoric of a common sense 'ought'. These representations are designed to be easily multiplied by mechanical or digital reproduction, and through overtly and covertly enforced compliance. There can be great profit in this, as shown by growing interest for online modules in universities as ways to reach large numbers of customers for small outlays in staff expenditure when compared to the tutorial model, with its sensitivity to individual features and physical attentiveness, reserved evermore for the moneyed. The representations provide a general model. In Joe Hughes' words, they are only 'capable of legitimate use when they remain tied to the conditions of their emergence' (56). For learning, this means that general representations are only legitimate when subservient to individual encounters.

For Deleuze, learning takes place in the midst of a flow of encounters. We merge in that flow, in an event replete with signs that we select by experimenting on them and by introducing novel disjunctions to the series of signs. An apprentice joiner is not the same as all others. Each woodworker varies in signs of strength, endurance, quickness of movement and mind, in bodily proportions, in resistance to pain across different places and situations, in commitment and resilience when wood fails to split along the grain, or when a customer changes plans for the tenth time in a month (I still like the idea of Rococo-Quaker . . . ). So when a pressure point arises, when a task is too much, or too boring, or seemingly impossible, the skilled master modulates recommendations to the potential and powers of each apprentice. Sometimes it will be right to say 'go home', sometimes 'try harder', 'try this tool', 'let me help', 'do it alone', 'it is fine to use an electric saw on hard woods, if time is short', 'tell them it cannot be done'.

There is a paradox in this lesson of lessons. It is in Deleuze's insistence on the singular and experimental qualities of learning through a conceptual and systematic philosophy. The demands of organised communication to a public are in tension with the message of individually tailored learning. As Hughes claims, in his chapter on politics, 'There is no political program. "Universal history," Deleuze and Guattari say, has no direction.' (143) I have just given a general version of a practice that should be radically individual, where radical means the individual can never be satisfactorily thought under general representations. At times, it appears that Deleuze must also depend on some kind of generality, though the more I study his words, the more they seem to resist systematisation. His doctrine about the genetic power of paradox, about the way it must be embraced as the genesis of thought and as an individual creative play which remains in movement, seems more important in taking up his ideas as multiple and unsettled. The conceptual and systematic sides of his work are balanced by persistent problems expressed through an ever-changing experimentation in thoughts and styles.

For teachers this paradox is a bane and an opportunity. We can see how much of a curse in the last sentence of the blurb chosen by Bloomsbury to market Hughes' book: 'This is the ideal introduction to Deleuze for any student of philosophy'. Deleuze's philosophy is a thorough critique of the notion of an ideal, with its roots in the transcendent Idea of classical Greek thought. In Difference and Repetition and The Logic of Sense, he advocates a reversal of Platonism such that the Idea explodes into a multiplicity of desires, pulls and variations of sensation consuming any identified concept or object, a celebration of the many over the One: 'We know, for example, that [Deleuze] is not Plato, that he is for immanence rather than transcendence, the multiple rather than the one, difference rather than identity, rhizomes rather than trees, and so on.' (27) In his philosophy of signs, this plays out as a commitment to singular modes and events against abstract universal ideals. Deleuze and Guattari are critics of the market imagined, made and needed by Bloomsbury. There is never 'any student'. There is only 'each' student. Each student is only really a multiplicity of changing singular features, loosely aligned at particular times: 'The ego opens itself to the surface and liberates the impersonal and pre-individual singularities which it had imprisoned like spores.' (44) The real danger of this work on markets is the misreading that if markets are reimagined away from mass reproduction, then they just might come closest to satisfying the demand for multiplicity and movement.

The opportunity of the paradox is the challenge it raises. It is the way we are forced to think about writing and teaching to a multiplicity of individuals. Hughes tackles the paradox of general instruction through the idea of a suspicious reading:

It's not just that the goodwill which is at the foundations of a whole ethics of writing is no longer operative, and it's not only that Deleuze might be willfully deceptive every now and then, the central difficulty here is that we cannot even be sure of the very signification of his words. At the same time, however, this forces us to take on new ways of reading: we need to read suspiciously, aware of Deleuze's will to deceive, and from the point of view of a linguistic indeterminacy in which the power of words is their mobility. (5)

The paradox of the particular and the general is taken up through a careful scepticism about the existence of a right reading. It is also folded into Hughes' interpretation, in the supposition that Deleuze cannot be straightforwardly taken at face value, because that single layer of truthful meaning is never available. More subtly, Hughes deploys his talents as a live teacher in his written style. This means the reader always has a sense of a conversation rather than a lecture, of a two-way interaction rather than a one-way transfer of truthful statements.

How is it possible to write as if live in the absence of the reader? How is it possible to read as if live in the absence of the author? I have taught with Hughes at yearly 'Deleuze camps', and I have enjoyed listening to him in seminars. His approach is a dialogue with the audience, regulated by careful analysis, tempered by humour, and broadened through many examples. This style used to be the preserve of the best analytic thinkers, forged in common room brio and jousting. Maybe a reversal is taking place. A new wave of continental teachers has honed live skills exactly when they have begun to wane elsewhere: reversals bred in external and internal opposition. The result is not so much a coffee shop debate as a marketplace dispute among citizens.

These qualities are transformed into the written text as a suggestive and idiosyncratic interpretation of Deleuze. Hughes works close to the text, but then takes risks with sweeping summaries and views. He gives many examples. He offers counterarguments, frequently seeking to undermine his own position. Difficult ideas are simplified, sometimes quite brutally, but then ambiguity and doubt are reintroduced later in order to soften the initial hard line. The rhetorical style is direct address. We are asked to 'notice' features as if a guide is physically drawing our attention to them and thereby giving us leeway to arrive at rapid divergence or misgiving. Hughes invites us to respond to questions. We follow statements in the present conditional that invite us to take a view on proposals. 'This is because, I would argue, [Deleuze] is most often thinking this material plane phenomenologically.' (37) Here, Hughes moderates the explanatory force of his causal account with an explicit statement of its speculative nature. Part of the charm of his reading comes from the quirkiness and theatricality of his explanatory asides. It is at first surprising to think of the post-structural Deleuze as harbouring phenomenological tendencies, but when we imagine a moving and horizon-bound eye, the idea of a plane inhabited by a limited viewpoint works as a complement to the thought that our worlds are essentially individual.

Nonetheless, a consistent and general argument runs through Hughes' book. It is that Deleuze's texts are defined by conceptual 'monotony', a term Hughes develops from Alain Badiou's controversial reading of Deleuze. I have reservations about the choice of words here. First, there is a matter of taste and linguistic associations. I cannot help feeling that Hughes has committed a faux pas similar to calling a common theme in a fashionista's wardrobe its 'beige-like' quality. There is nothing even remotely monotonous about Deleuze's concepts, if by that we understand dull, repetitious or unvarying. It is quite the contrary, for instance, in his recasting of the concept of repetition in Difference and Repetition as a variation over series rather than a repetition of the same thing. Second, the idea of conceptual monotony across Deleuze's, and Deleuze and Guattari's works, causes immense problems with regard to the differences in the periods, configurations, aesthetics and mechanisms of their concepts.

The idea of monotony is very bad at handling the evolution of concepts and structures, the way they emerge, reach maturity and fade. It is also a poor way to think about changes in the geometry of the structure, from manifolds in the work on Nietzsche, to kinds of dyad in Difference and Repetition, to dyads overlying multiplicities in the work with Guattari, to the gorgeous riff on baroque conceptual invention in Deleuze's The fold, Leibniz and the Baroque (I have borrowed the term 'dyad' from John Neil McGinness's 2013 Ph.D. Thesis On the Function of Ground in Deleuze's Philosophy Or An Introduction to Pathogenesis).

Monotony does a disservice to the aesthetic of Deleuze's philosophy because it sets it as an overlay to conceptual monotony:

Another way of putting this is to say that Deleuze's hidden emissions and slippages all tend towards the same basic underlying structure. Badiou captures at least two of the essential characteristics of the monotony: (1) a virtuosic variation of names, and (2) the essentially identical thought which underlies this variation. (14)

It seems to me that almost everything is the wrong way round and mistaken in nomenclature in this summary. First, aesthetic depth and complexity is presented in negative terms as 'emissions' and 'slippages', which prejudge them as dependent on that which they omit and slip from. However, if the aesthetic is described as an original layering of bifurcations and syntheses, as captured in Deleuze's use of disjunctive syntheses, then the conclusion that there is a monotonous ground underlying them is invalid. It is complex layers all the way down.

The passage I just quoted also shows the problems in structure and working implied by Hughes' dependence on Badiou's monotony. The idea that the structure is basic seems to me indefensible if we think of how such structures work. Deleuze's three syntheses of time do not form a basic structure if we think of it as self-identical and simple, as implied by Hughes' use of 'essentially identical'. Deleuze's idea of time is of a manifold of creative processes such that times are made by events and such that different modes of times transform each other through syntheses. An event such as a synthesis in the present contracts the past and the future. For example, the final scene of a film makes sense of the past and of the future differently depending on whether heroes and villains survive or die. The dénouement remakes the crescendo leading to it as tragedy or triumph. It shapes the future of the film as after-tale or mourning. The philosophy of time does not provide an essential, basic and identical structure since it is a manifold of processes that change emphasis and roles in the structure. My rendering of time through the present gives it a leading role and focus, but past events are conditions for that present, and if we focus on them the nature of the present changes. Future events can recast past presents, transforming them even as a prelude to those very futures. So Bourne did die, and it was only a replicant in later scenes. In the philosophy of time, aesthetic depth and complexity is not a cover for structural simplicity and identity, but instead a mode of expression for structural movement and multiplicity intrinsic to Deleuze's philosophy.

Hughes' argument about the monotony that underlies conceptual profusion can be observed at work on Deleuze's philosophy of time in the following passage on the first synthesis of time:

Deleuze gives the first passive synthesis a number of different names: habit (DR 73), imagination (DR 71, EP 241), connective synthesis (AO, LS), vibration (WP 168; FB 72) and perception (C1 62) to name only the most prominent. Across this proliferation of names and texts, its function remains constant: it carries out a synthesis of the matter distributed across the first given of Deleuze's system. (38)

Here, we are given a set of names across Difference and Repetition, Expressionism in Philosophy: Spinoza, Anti-Oedipus, The Logic of Sense, What is Philosophy?, Francis Bacon: the Logic of Sensation and Cinema 1. The names are taken as names for another name, 'the first passive synthesis', which is itself the name for a function. The function is meant to be monotonous across names and texts.

This is where the apparently descriptive nature of Hughes' approach breaks down. He is describing names and functions, as if these are readily there to be captured as secondary names, original name and function in a straightforward report of Deleuze's words. This is not at all the case in Deleuze's text. On the contrary, each name is the name for a different function which itself takes its place in a long chain of dialectical arguments and contextual situations. For instance, habit and imagination are different processes of synthesis, which take on different roles in Deleuze's adoption of ideas from Hume and Bergson in Difference and Repetition. The synthesis of matter is manifold and allows for multiple modes dependent on the place and levels of synthesis and on which synthesis of time takes precedence over others. Imagination is closer to the role of memory in the second synthesis of time than habit, which remains nearer to a synthesis based primarily on a living present.

Habitual movement is a synthesis of prior gestures. For example, a well-grooved arpeggio is a synthesis of many hours of practice on the guitar. Imagination is closer to creative work that involves a transformative function in the past and the intervention of the new, which itself opens on to the future. The past and open future intervene in the living present of the performance when there is a new effort to accent the arpeggio on a note and when techniques borrowed from folk playing are introduced. In terms of Deleuze's arguments, the subtle shift from habit to memory through imagination does not define a completely new function. It shows how functions involve changes in emphasis, priority and direction that explain how different syntheses interact, for instance, across a synthesis in the present (the successful arpeggio) and a synthesis in the past (the laying down of a feel for folk accents in the distant past).

So do these reservations amount to a rejection of Hughes' book despite its great pedagogical strengths? His combination of open style of presentation and insistence on a general structure across Deleuze's works is highly effective at providing a mapping and picture version of Deleuze's philosophy. We are given carefully crafted connections that allow for a good sense of some directions we can take through the work, rather than remaining baffled by the forbidding difficulty and depth of particular passages. Although some bafflement will certainly remain for those using the woefully inadequate index, which itself reflects some of the limitations of the book (for example, there are no entries for 'difference', 'differentiation', 'dramatisation', 'event', 'immanence', 'repetition' and 'time', all terms that a student might seek out in a book labelled as an introduction to Deleuze).

If we return to the individual tenor of Deleuze's ideas about apprenticeship, Hughes' mapping and repeating technique and generosity of presentation are better-suited to an apprenticeship needing to refer to Deleuze's books and ideas and to re-use them piecemeal in other areas, for instance, in literature or the arts, a kind of thinking as collage. As a critical and conceptual apprenticeship in philosophy or political theory, the book is much less helpful because it hinders critical analysis through the reductive model of monotony and the ensuing skewed set of rapid and contingent paths drawn through Deleuze's ideas, sources and lessons. As such, the way the book has been shoehorned into the requirements of a series with the title 'X after Deleuze' is unfortunate. This is not philosophy after Deleuze. It is a set of briefly sketched theories about different branches of philosophy set according to a structural mapping of Deleuze's many works.