Philosophy and Climate Science

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Eric Winsberg, Philosophy and Climate Science, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 270pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781316646922.

Reviewed by Carlos Santana, University of Utah


Eric Winsberg's book is timely and ambitious. One of his explicit goals is to make "a plea for a proper appreciation of the richness and complexity of climate science" aimed at philosophers of science, so that we might "appreciate the degree to which the conceptual, methodological, and epistemological issues that perennially preoccupy philosophers of science come to life in various interesting and novel ways in climate science" (227). Winsberg largely succeeds in this goal -- there are a number of places in the book where I thought "there's a good paper or three that could be written about that!" -- and that alone makes his book significant for the field.

But Winsberg's ambitions for the book are multifarious. Other members of his audience include "climate ethicists" who could "benefit from a philosophically informed presentation of the foundations of climate science" (4), as well as "students," "a wider general audience," "people studying general philosophy of science who prefer to see that material presented with real living examples," and "climate scientists curious about what philosophers think about their work" (5). I can't speak much to that last group, but I have some reservations about how fitting this book is for the others.

Let's start with the book's suitability for a general audience. Climate science, as Winsberg reminds us, is the paradigmatic example of a complex science studying a complex system. He rightly worries about rhetoric that compares demonstrating the anthropogenic origins of climate change to showing that "1+1=2," since this elides many of the epistemic and methodological complexities of the science (2). Consequently, understanding climate science is no mean feat, and many of the early chapters of the book are partially dedicated to crash courses in computer simulation, chaos theory, statistical inference, and other mathematical techniques used in climate science. For a non-specialist reader, however, a crash course isn't enough. Despite Winsberg using down-to-earth examples, like that of a belt buckle factory's quality assurance protocol to introduce Bayesian inference, this isn't an accessible introductory text to these quantitative techniques. It's both too little exposition for the novice and too much for the expert. I showed some of the relevant chapters to intelligent and well-educated non-scientists, and they found them rough going, due to the frequent formalisms, acronyms, and technical language. Given that many of Winsberg's arguments about climate science require a decent grasp of the methods behind the science, this is not the sort of book I would hand to someone without relevant background in at least some of the math and science involved, whether that person is a general audience member or an environmental ethicist.

I have similar worries about using the book as a classroom textbook, though I would definitely consider assigning some of the more essay-like chapters in a graduate seminar. Not only would the inaccessibility of many of the arguments stymie its use as a classroom text, but the book doesn't treat many of the topics with appropriate breadth for a textbook. For example, chapters 11 and 12 treat the topic of how to determine robustness among a set climate models. I would hesitate to use these chapters to teach students studying robustness in general, because many positions in the robustness literature receive cursory treatment. Winsberg is mostly keen to present what he sees as the most congenial analysis of robustness (Schupbach 2016), which he does cogently, but this means that the chapters don't give a broad introduction to the topic of robustness in philosophy of science. For the philosopher interested in climate science, this is fine; I found these chapters both apposite and persuasive. But the lack of breadth means that I wouldn't use them, as Winsberg suggests we might, as a way to teach the issue of robustness in an applied setting.

Similarly, many of the chapters lack depth, with Winsberg presenting a brief overview of an issue, putting forward his own position, and making too brief an argument for that position. Often there is little exploration of the ramifications of the argument or consideration of potential problems for his position. Again, as a stimulus to prompt philosophers to do more work on climate science, this is an effective tactic, but for other purposes I often felt as if chapters aborted just as they were getting to the good stuff.

For the rest of the review, however, let's set those issues aside. This may not be an all-purpose book on the philosophy of climate science, but it is a book that philosophers of science (and philosophically-engaged climate scientists) should be reading. Winsberg canvasses how both classic and recent topics in the philosophy of science matter to and can be informed by climate science. If you work in the philosophy of science or related fields like social epistemology, and want an answer to the question "how does my work matter in the real world?," Winsberg probably has an answer for you. Since the book is a collection of individual treatments not driven by a single thesis or arc, I'll illustrate its value by discussing only a couple of its topics. I'll recommend the book itself to those interested in the many topics I don't have space to address.

Among the chapters I'll leave to the side here are those which overlap some of Winsberg's previously published work. Some of his arguments for why most climate science is "immune to worries about the 'butterfly effect' that we associate with chaotic systems" (73) are found in Winsberg and Goodwin (2016). Similarly, his sophisticated discussion of the epistemology of climate simulation (Ch. 10) is grounded in ideas from his previous work on simulation, such as Winsberg (2010). While this book's application of these issues to climate science is worth a read, I'll instead present a couple of cases where Winsberg opens up some fertile new space for philosophers to engage with climate science.

One of these spaces involves the issue of how uncertainty is handled in climate science (Chs. 6 and 7). Winsberg observes that the Intergovernmental Panel on Climate Change (IPCC) reports present both quantitatively defined probabilities (e.g. very likely means >90% probability, and unlikely means <33% probability), and reports of confidence in statements containing those probabilities (e.g. high confidence or medium confidence). This fact raises several philosophically significant questions, to which Winsberg provides answers. How should we interpret the probabilities in the IPCC reports? As subjective credences. What justifies distinct confidence levels if statements already contain probabilities? Confidence levels reflect the quality and consistency of evidence as well as the degree of consensus. How do scientists arrive at probability levels, and how should they? Through ensemble models and expert elicitation. How are we to understand the subjective credence of a group? As a range containing the probabilities acceptable to most members of the group. All these questions are raised and addressed over the course of only a few pages, highlighting both the fecundity of Winsberg's book, but also its tantalizing lack of depth.

Take one of the other questions addressed in Ch. 7: "What are the sources of uncertainty with regard to climate projections such that they need to be reported as probabilities?" (90). Winsberg considers seven possibilities, and over the course of four pages makes the case that "the overwhelming majority of the error in our best climate models is due to three": "model structure," "parameter values," and "underexplored internal variability" (95). If Winsberg is right about this, he's discovered the important fact that uncertainty about projections is mostly due to modeling choices and not to lack of knowledge about the world ex silico. This is a surprising claim that it would be worthwhile for philosophers of science to address in more depth. For example, Winsberg dismisses uncertainty due to lack of social scientific knowledge, because "strictly speaking, climate projections themselves are conditional on these factors" (95). In the parlance of climate science, a projection is not a prediction; a prediction is an unconditional claim about the future (e.g. "The mean global temperature will be x ⁰C higher by 2100"), whereas a projection is a claim about the future conditional on certain conditions being met (e.g. a collection of claims of the form: "Given such-and-such an emissions scenario, by 2100 the mean global temperature will rise by x ⁰C").

But Winsberg moves too fast here. The social scientific facts underlying the scenario(s) on which a projection is conditional can safely be excluded as a source of uncertainty. But there may be other anthropogenic factors not accounted for in the scenario which may be sources of uncertainty. For instance, a projection may be conditional on levels of carbon emissions, in which case uncertainty about whether countries will meet stated emissions targets won't introduce uncertainty into the projection. But climate outcomes will also depend on other features of human behavior: how will construction and agriculture change the surface albedo of the earth? Will humans attempt large-scale climate engineering projects? Etc. Uncertainty about these climate-relevant sorts of human behaviors isn't explicitly accounted for by the model(s), and so can lead to uncertainty about the projection. There are similar problems for other potential sources of uncertainty that Winsberg dismisses. Perhaps these uncertainties are trivial enough that Winsberg is right to discount them, but determining so is going to require substantive engagement with these questions, an engagement that Winsberg invites more than provides.

Ch. 13, on social epistemology, similarly raises multiple intriguing issues in a way that invites future work. Winsberg's stated goal for the chapter is modest: "to illustrate the claim that climate science is, in a thoroughgoing way, a socially organized kind of science, and that many features of its epistemology need to be surveyed at the social level." I wouldn't take that claim to be controversial, since most of us now recognize that almost all science is thoroughgoingly socially organized. More compelling are Winsberg's specific claims about how social epistemology should approach climate science as a topic.

For instance, he addresses the question of whether the lay inquirer is better off validating the proclamations of the IPCC and other mouthpieces of the climate science community by either (a) familiarizing themselves with the science itself, or (b) verifying that "the community of [climate] scientists is well-ordered" (214). Given the impossibility of thoroughly accomplishing (a), since even climate scientists themselves can become expert in only a few subareas of climate science, Winsberg endorses (b). Note that this is a counterintuitive claim for many, since one prominent line of thought is that better educating the public in the science in the best way to increase acceptance of anthropogenesis. But if Winsberg is right, we should focus more energy on building trust in scientific institutions and experts. Again, Winsberg's claim deserves some more substantive engagement. After all, some empirical research suggests that even basic grasp of the mechanisms of climate change can change acceptance levels (Ranney and Clark 2016), while other research suggests that skeptics who distrust the institutions of climate science also reject evidence that those institutions are well-ordered because such evidence is just "part of the conspiracy" (Uscinski et al. 2017). This doesn't mean that Winsberg is wrong, only that it's going to take a more substantive debate and engagement with relevant empirical literature to determine the answer to the interesting social epistemology questions he raises.

As these examples should illustrate, I finished the book excited about the potential for good philosophical work to contribute to one of the most important areas of contemporary science. In light of that fact, the book's occasional struggles to make effective use of its limited space turn out to be a minor issue. Its core audience -- readers with extant interest in adjacent issues -- will find the book to be lucid and timely.


Ranney, M. A., & Clark, D. 2016. Climate change conceptual change: Scientific information can transform attitudes. Topics in Cognitive Science, 8(1), 49-75.

Schupbach, Jonah N. 2016. Robustness Analysis as Explanatory Reasoning. The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 69 (1), 275-300.

Uscinski, J., Douglas, K., & Lewandowsky, S. 2017. "Climate Change Conspiracy Theories." Oxford Research Encyclopedia of Climate Science.

Winsberg, E. 2010. Science in the age of computer simulation. University of Chicago Press.

Winsberg, E., & Goodwin, W. M. 2016. The adventures of climate science in the sweet land of idle arguments. Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part B: Studies in History and Philosophy of Modern Physics54, 9-17.