Philosophy and Conceptual Art

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Peter Goldie and Elisabeth Schellekens (eds.), Philosophy and Conceptual Art, Oxford University Press, 2007, 273pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199285556.

Reviewed by Robert J. Yanal, Wayne State University


This is a collection of fourteen pieces, arranged into four parts: conceptual art as a kind of art; conceptual art and aesthetic value; conceptual art, knowledge and understanding; and appreciating conceptual art. Actually, there is much overlap among the articles so that the division into parts has little significance. According to the editors, the "majority" of the papers were presented at a conference at King's College London in 2004. The book also has an introductory overview, a dozen illustrations, a round-table discussion among a few conceptual artists, and an index at the end. I would have liked a brief note about each of the contributors.

Peter Lamarque ("On Perceiving Conceptual Art") takes issue with a certain characterization: the physical form of a conceptual artwork is "secondary"; hence conceptual art is anti-aesthetic. This argument, Lamarque points out, is a non sequitur. Lamarque summons up literature, in which the way the words on the page look are irrelevant to literary appreciation, yet literary appreciation -- discovering themes and how narrative details contribute to those themes -- is an aesthetic activity. Lamarque admits that whatever ideas are represented by conceptual art are unlike literary themes, though holds that there must be a way of appreciating conceptual art that is analogous to literary appreciation. In part, we must experience conceptual art as distinct from the "real things" that they resemble. We are to perceive "saliencies and significance," which are not reducible to "the cerebral reflection of ideas in philosophy [nor] the apprehension of themes … in literature." Can more be said about these saliencies and significances? Some examples would have helped.

Derek Matravers ("The Dematerialization of the Object") gives a kind of historical account of conceptual art which variously embodies or argues against such writers as Clement Greenberg and Walter Benjamin. His bottom line is, "Conceptual Art emerged out of the perception that modernism -- and by extension, the traditional way of doing art -- was exhausted." Would someone, please, tell me what it means for a way of doing art to be exhausted?

According to Gregory Currie ("Visual Conceptual Art"), the conceptualists deny that "works of art are things primarily to be looked at." He holds that works of art are things to be looked at, but looked at "in the right way." The "right way" is "in the service of the artist who has made the thing we are looking at." Towards this end, Currie advances what he terms "Action-Result proposals," of which there are two forms: in one, the result has priority; in the other, the action (of producing the result) has priority. When the action has priority, we try to understand the appearance in terms of the action that produces it. In traditional art, the result has priority; in conceptual art, the action has priority. But here Currie lets the matter drop. How are we to explain why someone presented, say, a pile of clothes as art? What are the appropriate terms of the explanation? It is, for example, wondered why Goya produced the so-called black paintings of his old age: Was he mad? Disillusioned with politics? This seems to run in the conceptual art direction (priority of action over result) rather than the direction of visual art (priority of result over action); yet it would be false to classify the black paintings as conceptual art.

Robert Hopkins ("Speaking Through Silence: Conceptual Art and Conversational Implicature") asserts, "There exists conceptual art, that is art that can be fully appreciated (as art) without being the object of sense experience." Really? Why, then, do accounts of conceptual art, including the present volume, contain photographs of the works? Hopkins goes on to distinguish conceptual art from traditional art by claiming that in conceptual art but not traditional art, "The work's artistic properties are fully determined by a less than fully specific conception of its base properties." In other words, the artistic properties of a conceptual artwork can be ascertained even if the work is never realized in material form. I disagree. Doesn't the sight of Duchamp's Fountain elicit both the work's comicality and its odd forlornness? Would these be elicited from the "concept" alone? Hopkins, near the end, claims that it is not irrelevant whether the artwork is a deep hole or a urinal. Their "precise nature" is "irrelevant," he says, but what does that mean? It doesn't matter how deep the hole is? Or that the urinal is turned on its back? All that matters, apparently, is that the "expectation of sensory satisfaction" be "frustrated." But then, wouldn't one and the same piece of conceptual art, perhaps reproduced over and over, play that role? Why would we need a corpus of different conceptual artworks? As for the constant frustration of the expectation of sensory satisfaction that Hopkins attributes to every work of conceptual art, why should we bother? It would be like patronizing over and over a restaurant that refused to serve food. Hopkins's title refers to the Gricean concept of conversational implicature. Encounters with conceptual art are "conversations where our questions go unanswered," though as Hopkins admits, silence is a kind of answer. So we as it were ask the conceptual piece: "Why are you art where there seems to be nothing aesthetic?" Answer: Silence. And so on. Myself, I'd find another conversational partner.

Elisabeth Schellekens ("The Aesthetic Value of Ideas") sheds some light on the sorts of ideas conceptual art is supposed to express. She calls these art-reflexive ideas (e.g. Robert Barry's Inert Gas Series, which involves releasing helium gas into the atmosphere, brings up the "idea" that a work of art can exist without being seen); socio-political ideas (e.g. a 1970 work titled Q. And babies? A. And babies, a photograph of bodies piled up on a road in Vietnam, which refers to the massacre at My Lai; the piece is said to convey the idea that the war in Vietnam committed "gross injustices"); and philosophical ideas (e.g. a work by Michael Craig-Martin, An Oak Tree, which consists of a glass of water accompanied by a sheet of paper claiming that the object really is an oak tree though it bears the "accidents" of a glass of water -- an allusion to, probably a joke about, the metaphysical concept of transubstantiation). Schellekens claims that we must go further than simply entertaining the idea in the form of a proposition; the cognitive value of the work "lies in breathing life into the idea that it seeks to represent by making us grasp the idea phenomenologically," which is said to mean that conceptual works "trigger the imaginative exercise that can eventually lead to experiential knowledge …" A full investigation of this claim would take us well beyond the confines of a book review. I will just point out that a picture of bodies piled up proves nothing about justice or injustice; that is an extra-artistic, philosophical investigation. Schellekens thinks that ideas often have aesthetic qualities: the idea of transubstantiation can be "sublime," for example. I would agree. Duchamp's Fountain is witty, but not because there is something witty about urinals. Still, does Inert Gas Series express an idea with aesthetic qualities? Does And babies? I think not.

Diarmuid Costello ("Kant After LeWitt: Towards an Aesthetics of Conceptual Art") embraces a view dear to my heart -- especially since I defended it several years ago ("Duchamp and Kant: Together At Last," Angelaki, 7 (2002)). In sum: Kant, in The Critique of Judgment, defines fine art as the expression of "aesthetic ideas," which are "presentations of the imagination which prompt much thought, but to which no determinate thought … can be adequate." Of course, if Kant is right, every artwork expresses aesthetic ideas, whether by Poussin or LeWitt. The distinction Costello draws between traditional and conceptual art is that the latter makes a "liminal aesthetic use of its form," whatever that means.

Carolyn Wilde ("Matter and Meaning in the Work of Art: Joseph Kosuth's One and Three Chairs") considers Kosuth's work (also mentioned by Schellekens) in which three objects are placed in close proximity: a wooden chair, a photograph of that same chair to scale, and a placard of a dictionary definition of "chair". She presents Kosuth's loopy theory (fostered by Kosuth's reading of Ayer's Language, Truth and Logic) in which realistic art -- showing "how things are" -- is a (like a?) synthetic proposition (because it says something about the world), and abstract expressionism a mere non-propositional "ejaculation" (like statements about good and bad). Works that are "statements about what art is" are analytic, and in Ayer's parlance, say nothing about how the world is. Presumably conceptual art fits into the latter category, but surely if conceptual art makes a statement about what art is, it does say something about the world, namely which things are and are not art. (I think Wilde agrees.) In any event, Wilde does not endorse Kosuth's theory, partly on ground that Wittgenstein rejected the idea that all language is supposed to convey a proposition. The closest Wilde gets to a view of her own is this:

An interest in the conditions of art is an interest not just in the forms which art can take for its own sake. It is an interest in the ways in which a work of art can articulate the many different interests and meanings which we find in the world beyond the work itself.

But then, what role does conceptual art play in these "interests"?

David Davies ("Telling Pictures: The Place of Narrative in late Modern 'Visual Art'") takes issue with the claim that traditional art is distinguished from "late modern" art in the following way. The "appreciatable properties" of a traditional artwork are grasped only in an "experiential encounter" with the work and "any properties of a work not accessible in an experiential encounter … have no bearing on the work's artistic value." Late modern art -- Davies begins with Jackson Pollock -- is "discontinuous" with traditional art because late modern works require "an explanatory narrative" which sets out the meaning of the work; an experiential engagement with the work, unmediated by such an explanatory narrative, is insufficient to get at the work's appreciatable properties. The rest of his paper is puzzling in so far as it focuses on narratives that can be given to "explain" various late modern works, but does not mention any examples of traditional art where "explanatory narratives" must be brought in. Why do we need an explanatory narrative to appreciate, say, Renoir's Luncheon of the Boating Party?

Peter Goldie ("Conceptual Art and Knowledge") asks, given that conceptual art does not aspire to have aesthetic value, what other kind of "artistic value" might it aspire to? Some have said "cognitive value." Goldie sets out and then attempts to rebut an argument by James Young in Art and Knowledge whose conclusion is that conceptual art has "no non-trivial cognitive value." According to Goldie, Young says that traditional artworks -- "illustrative representations" -- can yield knowledge "not by constituting arguments to a conclusion, but by showing things in the right perspective." Picasso's Guernica does not constitute an argument that the bombardment of civilians is terribly wrong; but it puts audiences in a position where they recognize the rightness of its perspective. (Aside: How are audiences supposed to know that Picasso has the "right" perspective? Certainly not merely by looking at Guernica.) "Semantic representations" -- e.g. true declarative sentences -- have no cognitive value unless supported by argument. Conceptual works that are semantic representations are not accompanied by argument, therefore have no cognitive value. Goldie, in response, points out a kind of conceptual art that yields "significant what-it-is-like knowledge." The example is a work, Space Closed by Corrugated Metal, by Santiago Sierra, which was a sort of audience-participation piece: people were invited to the opening of a gallery only to be confronted by a building closed off by corrugated iron. Those who showed up came to know what it is like to be locked out from a place where one had a right to be (anger, frustration, etc.). Goldie says this knowledge is "non-trivial," as opposed to the "trivial" knowing-what-it-is-like to have an "optical bleed" (caused by Bridget Riley's Cataract III, staring at which leads to the experience of seeing colors not in the painting). Speaking for myself, I'd rather experience optical bleed, since I'm not familiar with it; I've already experienced anger and frustration, thank you. Goldie revisits An Oak Tree (remember that one? the glass of water claimed to be changed into an oak tree?). This is an example of a kind of work said by Young to be "discourse-dependent," which means works that "cannot be understood and do not represent, except in conjunction with what is said about them." An Oak Tree, Goldie claims, helps us to think about transubstantiation. This is cognitively valuable, not because it yields justified true belief, but because it "facilitates knowledge." So whether conceptual art has cognitive value depends on what one means by the term. Young means: justifies true belief, and an artwork can't do that. Goldie means: gets us thinking, and an artwork can do that. Of course, lots of art, conceptual and traditional, gets us thinking. Indeed, all kinds of stuff gets us thinking.

Kathleen Stock ("Sartre, Wittgenstein, and Learning from Imagination") begins by saying that "it seems plausible to claim that the imagination of the viewer is importantly involved in appreciation of [conceptual artworks]." But then we hear nothing more about conceptual artworks until the end when -- much, much later, after a complicated discussion of imagining in Sartre and Wittgenstein -- Stock arrives at the conclusion that one can, after all, learn about objects from images of them, and this conclusion "potentially deflects any concern about the role of imagining generally in understanding conceptual art." Yet we are never told what exactly the role of imagining is in understanding conceptual art except that it is "importantly involved".

Matthew Kieran ("Artistic Character, Creativity, and the Appraisal of Conceptual Art") aligns with Davies in attempting to draw similarities between traditional and conceptual art (though not the same similarities as Davies). Kieran is the more successful. We value art for the sensory experience involved and for the craft of the artist. Now conceptual art in general seems to offer deficient sensory experiences and little in the way of craft. But, we also value art for the "creativity and imaginativeness that has gone into the work," which is why we value a painting done by a person more than its perceptually identical twin which came about by accident -- thrown by a centrifuge, say. The reason why creativity and imagination are not seen in conceptual art, Kieran observes, is that viewers look for them in the material object alone. "But if we look at Duchamp's Fountain and ask ourselves what has the artist done, it looks as if, if we're looking at the end product, the answer is nothing." So we must look to the

creative processes of thought that have gone into whatever is presented before us and why … We evaluate such works as good or bad in terms of, amongst other things, the patterning of thought that has gone into them, their originality, subtlety, insight, wit, or daring.

But there's a gap here. If the "end product" (the conceptual art-object) shows no signs of creativity, how can we attribute creativity to the maker of that object?

Margaret Boden attempts to fill this gap. Her essay, "Creativity and Conceptual Art," applies "creativity" to ideas. "A creative idea is one that is new, surprising, and valuable" (though she sometimes speaks of events as being surprising -- e.g. the outsider winning the Derby). She distinguishes three types of creativity (borrowed from her book, The Creative Mind, 2004) with the goal of discovering which type is appropriate to conceptual art. "In exploratory creativity, the existing stylistic rules or conventions are used to generate novel structures (ideas) …" But since "conceptual artists reject previously accepted styles," conceptual art is not "grounded in" exploratory creativity. "Transformational creativity" alters "some defining dimension of the style or conceptual space … so that structures can now be generated which couldn't be generated before." Her example is Schoenberg's atonal system which "transformed the space of Western tonal music by dropping the fundamental home-key constraint." Boden straddles the fence on whether conceptual art exhibits transformational creativity. While she says that Duchamp's Fountain did not transform sculpture (since it isn't sculpture) and that John Cage's 4'33' (4'33' of silence) did not transform music (since it isn't music), she admits that such works have transformed the concept of art. "Combinatorial creativity involves the generation of unfamiliar (and interesting) combinations of familiar ideas." While this is Boden's definition, it seems to overlap too much with exploratory creativity. She might better have defined combinatorial creativity as substituting its denial for a familiar idea. Her examples of combinational creativity come in a list whose form is instead of this familiar idea, its denial: "Instead of personal making, execution by the hands of others … Instead of physicality, absence … Instead of sound, silence …" Of course, as Boden would insist, these denials must prove interesting. (Kant, in his third Critique, tells us that the genius produces original works but not "original nonsense.") I think Boden is on the right track, but I'm not convinced there is real distinction between transformational and combinatorial creativity. Certainly some of the achievements of modernism can be described as a denial of a familiar idea: instead of tonality in music, atonality (Schoenberg); instead of a sense of depth in painting, flatness (Pollock); instead of narrative ballet, abstract movements (Cunningham). One of the benefits of, well, combining combinatorial with transformational creativity is that conceptual art will exhibit the same sort of creativity as non-conceptual modernist works. (At least, I think that's a benefit.)

Dominic McIver Lopes ("Conceptual Art Is Not What It Seems") undertakes to explain the "appreciative failure" audiences exhibit towards conceptual art. Some think that conceptual art befuddles its audience because it demands they give up on traditional definitions of art. "The trouble," McIver Lopes says, "is that there is plenty of evidence that we are not committed to traditional definitions of art." For example, abstract paintings have "gained a relatively wide audience," yet "do not as a rule induce appreciative failure." The appreciative failure to which conceptual art is especially prone is to be explained by our commitment to a "folk ontology" of art. However, I'm left at a bit of a loss as to what this folk ontology is. McIver Lopes implies that it is an ontology of external things with relatively well-established functions: "Objects are available for looking at, sonic events for listening to, and stories for imagining." But then, could not conceptual art be fitted into this ontology? They would be objects (in a broad sense) for thus-and-such response on our part -- and here we would need to describe the response. Surely this folk ontology accommodates such objects-verging-on-abstraction as literature and music. Why not conceptual art? McIver Lopes suggests that the difficulty with conceptual art arises when we take its instances to be "plastic art" (pictures or sculptures) when they aren't. He calls this "the art-form hypothesis" (for explaining the lack of appreciation of conceptual art), but I'm unclear whether the art-form hypothesis is a special case of the "ontological hypothesis" (according to which conceptual art butts heads against some alleged folk ontology of art) or whether the art-form hypothesis is a separate thing. It probably doesn't matter. When new art-forms appear, they do not necessarily induce appreciative failure. Photography is not painting and movies are not plays; but their initial audiences did not thereby experience appreciative failure. Why then is conceptual art met with appreciative failure? I would say it's not because we mistakenly take conceptual artworks to be paintings or sculptures when they are not; rather, it's because we don't know how to take them. The problem is to give audiences some directions for responding to conceptual art. But McIver Lopes declines. "The question cannot be given a philosophical answer."

The book ends with a discussion by Michael Baldwin, Charles Harrison, and Mel Ramsden, members of Art & Language, "a collective of British artists founded in the middle of the 1960s." By and large, this is a sophisticated, witty, and at times cutting history of how conceptual art came to be. I'll point out one interesting distinction drawn "between conceptual art thought of on the one hand as a kind of Duchampian extension of minimalism occasionally outside the realm of middle-sized dry goods, and on the other as a fundamentally textual cultural practice." As for text-like conceptual art, Harrison has this to say. Suppose someone declares that everything perceived by his senses but not noted by his conscious mind during his trip to Baltimore is his work of art. "What do you mean?" we ask him.

The 'What do you mean?' is supposed by the artist and his admirers not actually to impinge on the assertion. To treat that assertion as a speech act -- or its textual equivalent -- is to commit a kind of foul. It seems nevertheless necessary to treat it as the speech act it actually is. But to do this is to impede it. What we had in mind was a kind of text in which the interrogative is included along with the appropriative claim -- and one which would therefore be an object of a quite different order. The consequence was considerably to increase the detail of the appropriative gesture -- the theoretical content that it wore on its face.

Well, no wonder conceptual art suffers from appreciative failure!

At this point, I think we could all do with a re-reading of the chapters on art as metaphor in Arthur Danto's Transfiguration of the Commonplace.