Philosophy and Exegesis in Simplicius: The Methodology of a Commentator

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Han Baltussen, Philosophy and Exegesis in Simplicius: The Methodology of a Commentator, Duckworth, 2008, 292pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780715635001.

Reviewed by John Sellars, UWE Bristol


This book is the first monograph in English (or any other language) devoted to the Late Platonic commentator Simplicius. Its focus is on Simplicius' methodology as a commentator. It deals at length with Simplicius' engagements with other ancient philosophers, from the earliest Presocratics, through the Peripatetic tradition (Theophrastus, Alexander), to contemporaries such as John Philoponus.

Who was Simplicius? He was a Neoplatonist working in the first decades of the sixth century AD under whose name five commentaries have come down to us from antiquity. These commentaries are on Aristotle's Physics, Categories, De Caelo, and De Anima, and the Enchiridion of Epictetus, although his authorship of the commentary on the De Anima has been a subject of scholarly debate. In these often lengthy commentaries Simplicius quotes from a wide range of philosophical texts where he thinks it relevant to his discussion of Aristotle's text and in the process preserves fragments from a number of otherwise lost works. Simplicius' chief claim to fame, then, is that he has become a vital source for our knowledge of Presocratic philosophy. Without Simplicius' commentary on Aristotle's Physics, our knowledge of early Greek philosophy would be significantly reduced.

This is the standard line. We should all be thankful to Simplicius for his habit of quoting texts in full rather than merely naming them in passing. We are thankful. But is there any more to him? Is Simplicius himself an interesting or significant philosopher? Is there anything more to him beyond his role as a doxographical source? Baltussen, in devoting a monograph to him, thinks there is but he is conscious many will not share that view. Consequently his book opens with an apologetic and slightly defensive Introduction in which he tries to make the case for reading Simplicius as more than merely a quarry from which to extract quotations. Part of the task includes a defence of Late Platonism (Baltussen deliberately avoids the usual label 'Neoplatonism'), to which Simplicius adhered. We are encouraged to put our reservations to one side and re-assess Simplicius afresh.

The opening chapter introduces Simplicius' method and practice as a commentator. His commentaries differ from many other examples from late antiquity to the extent that they don't seem to be straightforward records of oral lectures taken 'from the voice of' (apo phônês) the author. Instead they are extended written works, conceived as textbooks for pagan teachers explicitly designed to preserve as much as possible of the pagan philosophical tradition -- hence the extensive quotations. In these often lengthy texts Simplicius explicitly rejects originality but Baltussen argues that we ought not to take this at face value and that these expressions of modesty are in part made out of respect for his teachers.

The second chapter deals with Simplicius' role as a source for the Presocratics. Baltussen welcomes Catherine Osborne's approach of reading fragments of the Presocratics within their doxographical context, as this adds to Simplicius' potential significance.[1] What is important, of course, is to gain a sense of the motive and agenda of the doxographer. According to Baltussen, Simplicius' aim is to locate all of the Presocratics within a Late Platonic framework that emphasizes unity within the pagan philosophical tradition conceived as 'a single venerable and ancient message' (p. 56; see also p. 85). This may be so up to a point but to what extent would Simplicius welcome Democritus (or Epicurus) into this unified tradition? It would have been interesting to hear more about those thinkers who don't neatly fit within this syncretized history of philosophy, precisely because the points of disagreement might help to bring Simplicius' own position into sharper focus. Baltussen raises the question of whether Simplicius had access to the works of Presocratics directly or merely to collections of excerpts, but doesn't draw any firm conclusions either way.

The third chapter turns to Simplicius' use of early Peripatetics such as Theophrastus and Eudemus. Baltussen argues that Simplicius took the early Peripatetics -- and especially Theophrastus -- very seriously in his exegeses of Aristotle because Theophrastus would have known Aristotle personally, giving his glosses an added authority. This is a departure from the attitudes of previous Platonic commentators on Aristotle. Although Simplicius shares the wider Late Platonic desire to harmonize Plato and Aristotle, there is a also a strong desire to get Aristotle right, and no one is more likely to help in that task than Theophrastus. Baltussen suggests that we conceive Theophrastus himself as part of the Platonic commentary tradition (p. 95), given his own comments on the Timaeus, but philosophical engagement with a previous author is not quite the same thing as commentary.

The Peripatetic theme continues in the fourth chapter, which is devoted to Alexander of Aphrodisias. Baltussen offers a detailed and slightly laboured analysis of the motivations behind Simplicius' regular and extensive quotation from Alexander, but the question seems relatively straightforward. Why did Simplicius make use of Alexander's commentaries on Aristotle in his own commentaries on Aristotle? Because Alexander has lots of interesting things to say about Aristotle. The focus here again is on form rather than content, methodology rather than philosophy.

The fifth chapter examines the Platonic commentary tradition before Simplicius, and discusses Simplicius' use of Plotinus (p. 150) and the Post-Plotinian tradition of harmonizing commentaries from Porphyry onwards. Simplicius' immediate teacher Ammonius is discussed briefly (p. 163) but it would have been nice to hear more. For instance, we were told in the opening chapter that Simplicius' rejection of originality was mere self-deprecation, but presumably that claim could be tested to some degree via a comparison between his own views and those of his teacher. The same goes for his later mentor Damascius.

The final chapter turns to the theme of polemic and focuses its attention on Simplicius' exchanges with his arch-rival John Philoponus, another Platonic commentator, but also a Christian. Baltussen prefaces his discussion with an account of the tensions and hostilities between Christians and pagans in late antiquity. Once again, Simplicius is presented as the defender of an embattled pagan philosophical tradition, taking Philoponus to task for his attacks against Proclus and Aristotle in De Aeternitate Mundi Contra Proclum. Baltussen highlights the rhetorical aspects of Simplicius' polemics rather than the content of the dispute, so once more methodology is the principal focus. The intensity of Simplicius' personal references to Philoponus ('raving swine', in DC 156,25; cf. p. 185) are contrasted with his sober and respectful references to Alexander.

An epilogue sums up the proceedings. One of the central themes to emerge from the book as a whole is the claim that in order to understand what Simplicius is doing in his commentaries we must take into account his commitment to pagan religion as well as philosophy. We should see the commentaries not merely as 'scholarly schoolbooks' (p. 172) but rather as steps on a long road towards a more existential transformation. This religious dimension of Late Platonism should not be overlooked, Baltussen argues, if we want to understand properly what Simplicius is trying to achieve. The commentaries are his attempt to preserve the entire pagan philosophical and religious tradition within an increasingly hostile Christian world.

On this final point, as well as a number of others, Baltussen sketches a broad context within which to think about what Simplicius is doing but there is much less in the way of detailed analysis of what he actually did do, what he argued for, or what philosophical positions he himself held. This is in part simply a reflection of the sheer length of the commentaries themselves and no one could offer a detailed analysis of their contents within the covers of a single volume.

I said at the outset that five commentaries have come down to us under the name of Simplicius. Baltussen discusses only three of them. He puts to one side the De Anima commentary and he may well be right to do so, but it would have been nice to have seen a fuller discussion of the text and the question of its authorship.[2] He also more or less ignores the commentary on the Enchiridion of Epictetus. Although it does get the occasional mention (e.g. p. 43) Baltussen proceeds as if it doesn't exist, at one point writing 'all three extant commentaries' (p. 34). In his interesting attempt to reconstruct 'the library of Simplicius' (pp. 211-15), neither Epictetus nor Arrian get a mention. This is a great shame for a number of reasons. The in Ench. is unique as the only surviving commentary on a Stoic text to come down to us. Moreover, it is a commentary by a Late Platonist, and as a rule Late Platonists only wrote commentaries on Plato and Aristotle.[3] The way in which Late Platonists brought Aristotle into their curriculum is a well-worn subject, but the desire to bring in a Stoic text is quite unusual. It complicates Simplicius' activity as a commentator in a number of interesting and significant ways. Presumably Baltussen would argue that this is part of Simplicius' desire to unite and then preserve the entire pagan philosophical tradition in an increasingly hostile Christian world, but if that is the case then the in Ench. would form a potentially significant piece of evidence for Baltussen's thesis, one that has sadly been left out of the account.

There is much in Baltussen's book that is of interest, but I'm not sure how far it goes in fleshing out a more rounded portrait of Simplicius. The focus of the volume throughout is squarely on Simplicius' use of other authors -- i.e. his quotations -- rather than Simplicius as an author or a philosopher in his own right. Baltussen consciously avoids discussing Simplicius qua philosopher on the basis that this has been done by others elsewhere. This is true to an extent but what would be nice is a more synthetic volume that brings these discussions together in order to give us a complete picture. This book doesn't do that, although to be fair it doesn't ever claim to be trying to. What remains a desideratum, then, is a monograph that might combine Baltussen's methodological researches with an account of what is philosophically valuable in Simplicius. Most of my critical comments above have been asking for more discussion on various points, and no author can do everything in just one volume. I certainly hope that this book will encourage further work on Simplicius by both Baltussen and others that will help us to gain a fuller portrait of this still relatively neglected philosopher.

[1] See Catherine Osborne, Rethinking Early Greek Philosophy (London: Duckworth, 1987).

[2] For a discussion of its authorship see Carlos Steel's Introduction in Priscian, On Theophrastus on Sense-Perception, with 'Simplicius', On Aristotle On the Soul 2.5-12 (London: Duckworth, 1997), pp. 105-40.

[3] There are other exceptions, such as Hierocles' commentary on the Pythagorean Golden Verses, but that makes much more immediate sense within a Neoplatonic context than does a commentary on Epictetus' Enchiridion.