Philosophy and Medicine in the Formative Period of Islam

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Peter Adamson and Peter Pormann (eds.), Philosophy and Medicine in the Formative Period of Islam, The Warburg Institute, 2018, 316pp., £45.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781908590541.

Reviewed by Ignacio Sánchez, Warwick University


This is a collection of twelve articles presented at a Warburg Institute conference in March 2013. As the editors explain in the introduction, the aim of the conference was to explore the close links between medicine and philosophy in the first Islamic centuries, not only the engagement with the Greek intellectual tradition but also the use of philosophical argumentation in medical contexts and vice versa. These articles cover a wide variety of topics.

Many of the questions raised in the introduction are tackled by Peter E. Pormann in the first article, "Philosophical Topics in Medieval Arabic Medical Discourse: Problems and Prospects". Pormann surveys the entanglements between philosophy and medicine in early Islam by focusing on three particular themes: the mind-body problem and the link between physiological processes and intellectual and cognitive abilities; the use of philosophical concepts in medical epistemology as represented by the debate experience-reason; and the genre of Doubts (šukūk), whereby medical authors criticised the opinions of previous authorities, which Pormann introduces as "probably the most philosophical genre of medical writing".

The next three articles centre on the engagement with the Greek tradition. In "Hippocrates of Cos in Arabic Gnomologia", Oliver Overwien explores the genre of Arabic gnomologia as a vehicle for conveying Greek sapiential literature and also, occasionally, historical and biographical information. In particular, Overvien focuses on the sayings attributed to Hippocrates in two medieval Arabic collections, the Ethical Sayings of the Philosophers (Ādāb al-falāsifa) traditionally ascribed to Ḥunayn Isḥāq, and the Epitome of the Cabinet of Wisdom (Muntaḫab ṣiwān al-ḥikma) written by al-Siǧistānī. Whilst in the first work the treatment of Hippocrates deals with the treatment symptomatology of love-sickness and the cure of the "maladie of love", the maxims compiled by al-Siǧistānī are of moral tenor and portray the ideal image of a renunciant physician. Overvien discusses the process of transmission -- and distortion -- of these sayings from the late antique literary milieu into the Arabic sapiental corpus.

Rotraud Hansberger ("Length and Shortness of Life Between Philosophy and Medicine: The Arabic Aristotle and his Medical Readers") discusses the influence of the medical milieu in the Arabic reception of Aristotle's Parva Naturalia. After explaining the peculiarities of the Arabic version of this work (which is an adaptation rather than a translation) of three of the seven original Greek books, Hansberger focuses her discussion on one particular book, the Arabic version of On Length and Shortness of Life, and compares it with Qusṭā ibn Lūqā's work on the same topic, On Length and Shortness of Life and the Physiognomy of the Long-lived. She cogently argues that the Neo-Platonic elements introduced into the Arabic version of the Parva Naturalia -- also present in Qusṭā ibn Lūqā's work -- indicate that this Aristotelian work was essentially received and read as a medical text. Hansberger discusses these medical biases as a plausible explanation for understanding the peculiarities of the Arabic version.

James Montgomery's "Al-Ǧāḥiẓ, Falsafa, and the Arabic Hippocrates" centres on the engagement of the Abbasid theologian and polymath al-Ǧāḥiẓ with the Greek medical and philosophical tradition, especially Hippocrates. He begins by discussing the famous critique of translation reported by al-Ǧāḥiẓ in his Book of Living (Kitāb al-ḥayawān), and its relevance to understanding the reception of the Greek tradition. Montgomery explores first the concept of falsafa in several Ǧāḥiẓian works, including a hitherto untranslated fragment of al-Ǧāḥiẓ that has preserved a caricature of a self-portrayed expert in speculative theology. He also discusses the reception of Greek medicine in several works of al-Ǧāḥiẓ, especially his engagement with the Hippocratic corpus, which, according to Montgomery, provides intellectual tools to analyse the society as an organic body subjected to diseases and, therefore, open to diagnosis and cure.

In the volume's most substantial article, "Early Kalām and the Medical Tradition", Gregor Schwarb presents a detailed survey of the relationship between Muslim theology and medicine in the formative period of Islam, and also an edition and translation of two chapters from Muḥammad ibn ʿAlī Mazdak's commentary on Ibn Mattawayh's Kitāb al-taḏkīra fī aḥkām al-ǧawāhir wa-l-aʿrāḍ. Following the thesis advanced by Tzvi Langermann,[1] the first part of Schwarb's article addresses the influence of Greek medical notions in theological debates, especially the anti-atomism of the Hippocratic theory of the stochastic elements advanced in On Nature of Man and taken up later by Galen. Langermann postulated that Galen became an authoritative voice for those who denied creation due to his understanding of the world as a self-contained system governed by its own laws. Schwarb takes this thesis further to show how Muslim theologians developed a sophisticated theory of atomism to defend the role of God as Creator, providing an important re-evaluation of the influence of Galen in kalām. Schwarb discusses a second major physician, al-Rāzī, whose philosophical work is to a great extent a reaction against Muʿtazilism and who is regarded as a heretic by Muslim theologians. Schwarb's article is a very important contribution toward understanding the relationship between philosophy, medicine and theology in Islam, especially the influence of these disciplines in kalām cosmology and their reinterpretation by Muslim theologians who sought to provide a counterargument against the discourse of Hellenised falsafa.

Pauline Koetschet's "Abū Bakr al-Rāzī on Vision" also addresses the Arab refutation of Galenism, particularly al-Rāzī's discussion of Galen's theory of vision, which she considers "the first act of the intromission-extramission debate that will structure the field of optics in Islam". Koetschet thoroughly discusses the theories of vision current in the ninth century, paying special attention to Galen's extramission theory and the Aristotelian basis of his critique against the intromission theory. She analyses Al-Rāzī's refutation of this theory in light of Galen's anti-atomism, the works of Aristotle's commentators, and the weight of al-Kindī's Neoplatonic influences.

Peter Adamson and Hans Hinrich Biesterfeldt's "The Consolations of Philosophy: Abū Zayd al-Balḫī and Abū Bakr al-Rāzī on Sorrow and Anger" centres on the problem of body and soul (already discussed by Pormann) with particular focus on the theory of emotions. The aim of the authors is: first, to explore the parallelisms and links between two tenth century works discussing the topics of sorrow and anger: al-Balḫī's Benefits for Souls and Bodies (Maṣāliḥ al-abdān wa-l-anfus), and al-Rāzī's Spiritual Medicine (al-Ṭibb al-rūḥānī); second, to shed light on the elusive identity of Abū Zayd al-Balḫī. The comparison of both works suggest, according to the authors, the use of a common source. The translation of al-Balḫī's chapter on anger is included as an appendix to the article.

Aileen Das' "Beyond the Disciplines of Medicine and Philosophy: Greek and Arabic Thinkers on the Nature of Plant Life" also centres on the Galenic tradition, particularly on the medical perspective adopted by Galen to discuss plant life, and on its influence on the approaches of the Iḫwān al-Ṣafāʾ and Avicenna, who combined philosophical principles with medical theories. Of particular interest is Das' analysis of Avicenna's reliance on his medical background to frame philosophical problems, a finding that challenges Avicenna's apparent epistemological disregard for medicine.

"Al-Ṭabarī and al-Ṭabarī: Compendia between Medicine and Philosophy", by Elvira Wakelnig, explores the disciplinary divide between philosophy and medicine in the reception of two medical compendia written respectively in the ninth and tenth century: ʿAlī ibn Rabban al-Ṭabarī's Paradise of Wisdom (Firdaws al-ḥikma) and Abū l-Ḥasan al-Ṭabarī's Hippocratic Treatments (Muʿālaǧāt al-buqrāṭiyya). The article examines two epitomes of the philosophical sections of the Paradise of Wisdom, and several philosophical works that make use of this work. Wakelnig argues that Rabban al-Ṭabarī was not regarded as a philosophically interesting author, and that his reception depended on whether his compendium was taken as a medical or a philosophical work. In contrast, Abū l-Ḥasan al-Ṭabarī was well-versed in philosophy and has preserved quotations from lost Greek works, but his work has been largely overlooked by scholars because of similar prejudgements.

Like Koetschet's article on vision theories, Badr el-Fekkak's "Cosmic, Corporeal and Civil Regencies: al-Fārābī's Anti-Galenic Defence of Hierarchical Cardiocentrism" addresses the engagement of Muslim authors in the debates concerning the disagreement between Aristotle and Galen, particularly the opposition between encephalocentric and cardiocentric theories of the mind. Al-Fārābī, probably the most acute and relevant critic of Galen, was a proponent of Aristotelian hierarchic cardiocentrism. A good part of his critique against Galen was based, according to el-Fekkak, on the contention that he was thinking as a physician, not a philosopher, and therefore failed to grasp the wider philosophical implications behind the hierarchy of the parts of the body and their functions, which al-Fārābī discuses in both physiological and cosmological terms.

Raphaela Veit's "The Small Canon of Medicine (al-Qānūn al-ṣaġīr fī l-ṭibb) Ascribed to Avicenna" centres on the relationship between Avicenna's Canon and Small Canon. After a thorough comparison, Veit concludes that while there is no direct dependence between them, the dissimilarities might show some biases in the reception of Avicenna. An interesting aspect Veit discusses is Avicenna's adaptation of Galenic theories to accommodate the Aristotelian philosophical system, a recurrent strategy in the Canon of Medicine, which contrasts with the Small Canon, where the Galenic view is always followed.

The last article, Hans Hinrich Biesterfeldt's "ʿAlī ibn Riḍwān on the Philosophical Distinction of Medicine", centres on the Egyptian physician Ibn Riḍwān and his defence of the Galenic model of doctor/philosopher, which is based on three main points: the student's need to learn the philosophical disciplines, the role of logic in the demonstration of medical truths, and the ethical implications of the profession.

This short summary cannot not do justice to the volume's depth of complexity. The book is a very useful contribution to the intellectual history of the formative period of Islam due to the excellent quality of its articles, but more particularly because of the originality of the topics and the approaches the authors take. I will briefly comment on two important features that become apparent when considering the volume as a whole: the multivalent reception of the Galenic tradition, and the importance of addressing the agency behind the transmission and translation of medical and philosophical texts.

Even though Galen is only explicitly mentioned in the title of one article, his legacy is discussed, directly or indirectly, in most of the contributions. These discussions are of particular relevance for re-evaluating the relationship between medicine and philosophy and for shedding light on the conflict between Aristotelian and Galenic theories. Some articles approach the reception of Galen by focusing on two of his most important critics: al-Rāzī and al-Fārābī. Pormann highlights the philosophical dimension of al-Rāzī's Doubts about Galen (Šukūk), a work traditionally read as a medical text, when discussing the role of the retentive faculty. Koetschet's analysis of the theories of vision reveals the philosophical contention underlying al-Rāzī's position in the intromission-extramission debate and his engagement with Aristotelian and Galenic paradigms. Veit's comparison of Avicenna's Canon and the anonymous Small Canon tackles a similar problem when she analyses Avicenna's strategies to accommodate Galen's medical theories within the Aristotelian philosophical framework. El-Fekkak, in turn, focuses on al-Fārābī's critique of Galen's cardiocentrism and the philosophical implication of the physiological hierarchy. Schwarb, who discusses the role that Galen's anti-atomism and teleological providentialism played in the debates on God's creation, shows that Galen also influenced theological debates. These contributions address a wide range of topics and provide a fantastic overview of the complex and by no means univocal reception of the Galenic medical tradition. They reveal the wide panoply of intellectual strategies used to accommodate Galenism within various philosophical -- and theological -- paradigms.

A second aspect that underlines many of the approaches adopted by the authors is the agency behind the translation and transmission processes, its role in the reception of Greek culture, and its implications for the disciplinary divide between philosophy and medicine. The problems underlying the reception of Greek tradition are explicitly thematised by Montgomery, who discusses al-Ǧāḥiẓ's reports on the untranslatability of poetry and books, and is always careful to note in his article the conceptual distance between the Arabic falsafa and philosophy, and medicine and ṭibb. Similar concerns are raised in other articles. Overwien focuses his analysis of the Hippocratic gnomologic tradition on its deviation from ancient sources and the agency behind the collection and transmission processes. Schwarb's discussion of Galenism is predicated on the fact that the Ǧālīnūs that Arab scholars could read in Arabic translation was a "Christianised Galen", and his On the Usefulness of the Body Parts, a core text in the debates on God's design. Other contributions highlight the epistemological implications of recontextualising particular texts. This is the case in Pormann's discussion of the tradition of Hippocratic commentaries and Hansberger's analysis of the relationship between medicine and philosophy in the Arabic Parva Naturalia, which leads her to conclude that the Arabic translation of the work was, de facto, an adaptation to a large extent motivated by the medical biases of translators and audiences. Wakelnig's study reveals how the reception of the works of Rabban al-Ṭabarī and Abū l-Ḥasan al-Ṭabarī depended on whether they were read qua philosophers or qua physicians. And Biesterfeldt also tackles the problem of transmission of science, since Ibn Riḍwān was an author especially distrustful of teachers and all forms of ancillary medical literature and obsessed with the proper transmission of authoritative knowledge.

The questions raised in these articles clearly show that the relationship between philosophy and medicine depended, to a great extent, on the intellectual activities associated with the transmission of texts. This is a fantastic example of how this volume might shed light on aspects of the history of medicine and philosophy that still need much research. But reducing these problems to the field of intellectual history might also be misleading. The development of Islamic medicine and its relationship with philosophy were not free from social constraints. In the ninth century, Ibn Qutayba claimed that "nobody is more irreligious than physicians"; a century later, the vizier Ibn ʿAbbād still held that "medicine is a ladder of heresy". Like philosophy and philosophers, medicine and its practitioners have been the target of numerous attacks throughout the history of Islam irrespective of their religious affiliation. The articles of Montgomery and, especially, Schwarb tackle this question. The weight of theological debates is also implicit in many of the contributions, although not explicitly addressed. But the implications of this conflict are deeper, and the line between medicine and philosophy was often drawn out of theological concerns. This book was not the place to thematise the relationship between medicine and theology, but the particular aspects of this problem that emerge from its articles prove the need to reassess this question.

In conclusion, this is a very important contribution to the study of philosophy and medicine in the formative period of Islam. It is also a very demanding book, but its scope and relevance go beyond the disciplines explicitly addressed in the articles. It would certainly be of interest to scholars working on all aspects of intellectual history. The Warburg Institute and the editors should be commended for putting together this extraordinary collection of articles.

[1] Y. Tzvi Langermann, “Islamic Atomism and the Galenic Tradition”, History of Science 43/3 (2009): 277–295.