Philosophy and Museums: Essays on the Philosophy of Museums

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Victoria S. Harrison, Anna Bergqvist and Gary Kemp (eds.), Philosophy and Museums: Essays on the Philosophy of Museums, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 385pp., $39.00, ISBN 9781107545670.

Reviewed by Elisa Caldarola, Università di Padova


This volume collects fifteen essays debating the value of museums, the ontology and epistemology of exhibited objects, and museum ethics. The essays stem from talks originally given at a conference at the University of Glasgow in 2013 by philosophers working both within and outside the analytic tradition, museum scholars, and museum practitioners. The collection succeeds in showing that we need a philosophy of museums to improve our understanding of such institutions.

In the opening essay, Mark O'Neill describes a number of questions calling for the engagement of philosophers with museums: What types of value do museums have? What is the ethically correct stance for a museum to take towards its public? And towards the objects constituting its collection? Should museum exhibits seek to make a claim to objectivity? Garry L. Hagberg and Anna Bergqvist each discuss the objectivity of museum exhibits. In a Wittgensteinian fashion, Hagberg criticizes the conception of the meaning/content of exhibited art objects as a determinate "ingredient" (274) of such objects that visitors can identify, claiming that "articulating meaning-content  . . .  is more a matter of discerning implication, of drawing out lines of significance, of throwing light by comparison" (276) and that "we have criteria for separating (a) meaning-revealing  . . .  and connection-making sets of comparative objects from (b) false, thin, misleading, implausible, and unworkable groupings of objects that  . . .  do not 'speak' to each other" (288). A good curator, then, should master the art of putting together objects in a way that allows for fruitful comparisons among them and emergence of their relevant aspects, as various examples of exhibited art objects discussed by the author show.

Engaging with debates on the role of authorial intentions in art interpretation and on semantic particularism, Bergqvist argues, on a similar note, that "The meaning [of exhibited objects] is not to be found in the narrative [of a certain museum exhibition], whether in terms of some 'authoritative' curator's construction or the individual viewer's perspective. The narrative can reveal (or conceal) the object's meaning -- but it does not determine the object's meaning" (311). Furthermore, Bergqvist observes that, although the meaning of exhibited objects does not change depending on who is looking at them, such objects "cannot be accessed except through a perspective" (316). She then argues that the development of different and incompatible perspectives on exhibited objects should be encouraged, in order to maximize the chances for different kinds of viewers to access the meanings of such objects. The arguments put forward by Hagberg and Bergqvist mark a turning point in the debate on the accessibility of the meaning of exhibited objects, mobilizing some resources of analytic philosophy to show that we should refrain from organizing such debate purely in terms of subjectivist or objectivist approaches to the meaning of art objects and other exhibited objects.

Various contributors discuss the value of museums. Charles Taliaferro develops Popper's view of "philosophy as a practice of independent, critical reflection not bound by the tyranny of either government or group  . . .  identity" (39).  He goes on to argue that a good role for museums would be that of fostering a culture informed by philosophy by, for instance, helping define the identity of a philosophical culture through their exhibits, exposing and criticizing "exploitive and unjust events of the past" (45), guaranteeing non-wealth-dependent access to a site where philosophical culture is practiced, and offering a site for public debate. On a different note, Ivan Gaskell argues that the key value of museums is cognitive: it lies in their being "site[s] of scholarship", which "produce ideas", often in the form of displays and accompanying catalogues (58). An apt example is the model for Holocaust museums described in Paul Morrow's essay, which puts research on the relevance of exhibited objects at the core of such museums. Referring to Steve Conn's analyses, Gaskell explains that museums used to be focused on scientific inquiry, at the time the latter was based on "observation, collection, taxonomic investigation and comparison" (66), and that they lost this character because of the shift of scientific practices towards experimentation at the end of the XIX century. Gaskell observes, however, that now we are experiencing "a reinvigoration of the possibility of making knowledge claims from tangible things" (60) and that this could help museums regain centrality as producers of ideas. Among the examples of this "Tangible Turn" (60), there are collaborations between anthropologists and indigenous communities in devising exhibits of artifacts that are of interest to both, as well as new research conducted in natural history museums by biochemists and computer scientists and in art museums by conservation scientists. Gaskell concludes that a main challenge for contemporary museums consists in lowering barriers among different kinds of museums, different collections, or even different divisions within the same museum, in order to enhance innovative thinking.

According to Michael P. Levine and Beth Lord, the affective value of exhibited objects is also relevant to museums. Levine claims that, from a psychoanalytic perspective, it can be argued that "art, but also other objects, exhibitions, and performances as well, elicit emotional, wishful, as well as cognitive responses best characterized as nostalgic" (87). Lord analyses the connection between museums and wonder, based on Descartes' and Spinoza's views of wonder. According to Descartes, wondering at unknown objects is good only if it leads to attempts to understand them intellectually. According to Spinoza, wonder is a threat to imagination: imagining an object is naturally linked with imagining other objects that we have experienced it with or that share features with it -- activities which, he claims, are at the basis of reasoning. When we see an unusual object which we cannot associate to any other object, however, all we can do is wonder at it, our imagination cannot progress and there is no chance that we get from an experience of wonder to the acquisition of rational knowledge. Inspired by Descartes and Spinoza, Lord cautions against the dangers of wonder in museums: "in reorienting displays away from heavily interpretative and contextual approaches and towards wonder, museums do not necessarily encourage visitors to construct meaning from objects, and they risk obstructing meaning making entirely" (112). Moreover, she finds in Spinoza remarks on a different feeling that, she claims, museums should promote: that of "active joy" (113), which is not a passion determined by external causes, but what we feel when we are aware of the activity of our mind. A museum of natural history, for instance, could promote active joy by arranging "things into concentric circles of similarity to human being" (114) and prompting visitors to reflect on the relationship between human beings and nature, so that visitors could feel active joy while gaining knowledge.

Sarah Hegenbart explains how a good participatory art museum would work, basing this explanation on her virtue-theory inspired account of the evaluation of participatory art -- "art that requires the active collaboration of the audience in order to realize its aesthetic value" (321) and which is usually encountered "within the realm of the everyday reality of the audience" (322). According to Hegenbart, participatory artworks do not "possess content prior to the participation of the audience" (238) and have not only aesthetic but also ethical aspects, in that they have an impact on the participants' lives. She claims that the participants who successfully construct the content of the artworks are those who are capable of responding creatively to challenges -- which, according to Julia Annas, means that they are virtuous. A good participatory art museum, then, should "provide a space in which the visitor can exercise and cultivate their virtues in order to bestow the participatory artwork with value" (336). Although the collected essays discuss a variety of values attributable to museums, it seems to me that they all share a general, unitary view of museums as institutions devoted, essentially, to education (be it political, scientific, moral, or sentimental), challenging the possibly more widespread view of museums as repositories of (valuable) objects and places for leisure.

Graham Oddie and Constantine Sandis discuss ontological issues about exhibited objects. Observing that, for example, Tutankhamun's death mask is not identical to any material particular, because it has features (such as the property of being destroyed when heated to 1000C) that the material particular it would most likely be identical with (i.e. a certain lump of gold) does not possess, Oddie argues that "the objects we experience in a museum are neither particulars nor properties. Rather  . . . they are offices or roles. Like properties, roles are abstracta rather than concreta. But, like concreta, offices involve a singularity that properties lack" (222). According to this view, then, "Tutankhamun's death mask is  . . .  an office that a particular [possessing certain properties] can occupy" (225-226) and "To see Tutankhamun's death mask is to bear an intentional relation to that role" (239). One advantage of this view is that it allows for explaining how exhibited objects can easily go out of existence: it suffices that a single requisite for their role is destroyed, e.g., for Tutankhamun's death mask, possessing the shape of a death mask. Another advantage is that, by understanding restoration as "the process by which occupancy is restored to an empty role" (233), the view allows for understanding what are the salient properties of a particular that need be restored in order not to leave the office it occupies vacant (i.e. lose the exhibited object).

Sandis considers perfect replicas of artifacts, arguing that they are not necessarily aesthetically inferior to original objects and that, depending on the purpose of a museum, a replica might work for it just like the original, or even better -- "Would you rather see the original Mona Lisa behind a barrier and glass screen amidst a crowd of tourists in the Louvre or a perfect replica sat between pillars as Leonardo had conceived it?" (254). Oddie and Sandis challenge intuitive views about what exhibited objects are and what they can do for the public, showing that philosophical arguments can help improve the ways we approach exhibited objects.

Some essays address issues in museum ethics. David Brown defends the view that museums exhibiting religious art and sacred objects should present exhibits focusing not only on the aesthetic or documentary qualities of such objects, but also on their religious/spiritual ones, in order to allow visitors to engage with such objects at a religious/spiritual level. This would be respectful towards those visitors interested in religious and sacred objects because of their religious/spiritual views and, moreover, it would give all visitors a chance to experience such objects in a way that approximates more to their original way of existence. Brown, then, judges positively, for instance, exhibits of altarpieces in rooms that recall their original setting, of Muslim rugs facing the direction of the Mecca, and of Buddha statues whose gestures' theological significance is carefully explained in some accompanying text.

Andreas Pantazatos focuses on the ethics of trusteeship, offering an insightful account of how museums should perform the duty of care they have to the objects in their collections, i.e. "the duty to negotiate the transit from past to future of the objects in their care in such a way as to secure their significance" (182). He explains that museums are entrusted not only with the custody of objects with a certain history but also with the task of negotiating between different views of such objects, held by the various individuals and groups who have a stake in them. For instance, the National September 11 Memorial Museum at Ground Zero is right in its choice not only to preserve the remains of the Twin Towers, but also to take care of the memories of people involved with the September 11 tragedy at some level (for instance, by telling stories those people told about such events).

On a similar note, Philip Tonner argues that "a museum's function is, to many collectors, benefactors and visitors, to act as a material custodian of our memories and as such its ethical burden is responsibility not only to collect, conserve and to communicate, but to do so truthfully" (170). Museums, then, face the issue of whose testimonies about exhibited objects should be trusted. This is particularly relevant in cases such as that of Holocaust museums, as Tonner stresses in his discussion of the United States Holocaust Museum.

Alda Rodrigues asks whether museums are ethical at all, examining two apparently contrasting views held by the archaeologist Quatremère de Quincy (1755-1849): (1) the now widespread view that museums are detrimental to our experience of the art objects they exhibit, because they take such objects out of their context, thereby preventing us from experiencing them under appropriate conditions; (2) the view that the Parthenon Marbles had to remain in the British Museum because there they had more chances to be integrated in European cultural life than in Athens. Rodrigues sees an affinity between Quatremère's latter view and Heidegger's claim in The Origin of the Work of Art that, in order not to lose significance and value, works of art should be able to open up a world -- i.e., in Rodrigues' interpretation, to be enjoyed in a way such that they become central to the lives of their public. Rodrigues reconciles Quatremère's apparently contrasting views, claiming that the objection raised by (1) "persists if  . . .  the work of art is treated [merely] as an object, and not as the focal point of its own world" (211). She concludes that, in assessing the ethical standing of contemporary museums, we should take inspiration from Quatremère, realizing that:

By exhibiting objects in contexts that are different from their original site, museums call people's attention to one of the most interesting features of the existence of objects in time: the possibility of their survival both beyond the cultural world within which they came into existence, and beyond the intentions of their maker. (213)

The essays on museum ethics show that the roles of different publics are key to understanding museums. In particular, they depict the publics of museums not just as recipients of narratives developed by museum professionals, but also as subjects that may come equipped with specific relationships to exhibited objects -- relationships that museum professionals should take into account in order to perform their role of custodians of exhibited objects appropriately.

The volume ends with an appendix presenting three contributions on museums and philosophy by students from the Hutchesons' Grammar School in Glasgow: Scott Adams, Lucy McCracken, Glen Melville, Jessica Palmer, and Claire Richmond. The essays are the result of a project undertaken by the students under the guidance of their professor, Philip Tonner -- also a contributor to the volume. They show how meditation on philosophical texts can offer a valuable means for thinking about exhibited objects and the experience of visiting a museum, not only to professional academics but also to a much younger, non-professional public.

This book addresses a vast range of issues, from different methodological perspectives, on topics rarely discussed in philosophical literature. The main merit is to show that there is an ample territory open to philosophical debate and that philosophers can usefully contribute to address problems faced by museum professionals. The main limitation of the volume is that it packs such abundant material in the limited space of a collection of essays. The reader would have benefited from a presentation of the collected essays within a handbook offering more introductory information on the topics under discussion. In the same spirit, the reader would have profited from a more thorough discussion of topics that are merely touched upon, such as how narratives are constructed through museum exhibits, what is the appropriate ontology of museums qua institutions, and how the educational mission of museums should be negotiated with the economic, managerial, and political issues faced by such institutions.