Philosophy and Non-Philosophy

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François Laruelle, Philosophy and Non-Philosophy, Taylor Adkins (tr.), Univocal, 2013, 248pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781937561123.


Reviewed by Ian James, Downing College, University of Cambridge


Until recently the writing of François Laruelle has suffered a relative neglect within the Anglophone reception of French thought. Such neglect perhaps results from the fact that he aims to write from a position that would make a decisive break from philosophy and does so in such a way that philosophers themselves might find his work unpalatable or nonsensical. Perhaps more likely still, this relative neglect might result from the fact that Laruelle's writing can often be extremely difficult to access. As Graham Harman rightly remarked in his review of the English translation of Philosophies of Difference (NDPR, 2011.08.11), Laruelle's prose style alone can be considered to be one of the biggest obstacles to his potential inclusion in the canon of major recent French thinkers. There are times when his rhetorical and conceptual abstruseness can make even the most difficult and opaque passages of say, Derrida or Lacan, appear to be, in comparison, as clear and self-evident as the Cartesian method. Yet, since 2006 John Mullarkey's Post-Continental Philosophy: An Outline and Ray Brassier's Nihil Unbound (2007) have shown that Laruelle is being taken very seriously by at least some important figures within the Anglophone philosophical community that is engaged with contemporary French philosophy. This makes the publication of Taylor Adkins excellent translation of Philosophy and Non-Philosophy all the more welcome since it introduces this foundational work of Laruellian non-philosophy to English speakers for the first time since its original publication in 1989.

Philosophy and Non-Philosophy, together with the as yet untranslated En tant qu'un: La "non-philosophie" expliquée aux philosophes, offer by far the best, and perhaps also the clearest introduction to this difficult body of thought. It is a shame that they were not both translated some time ago and deeply regrettable that the translation in 2010 of his less mature and less accomplished work, Philosophies of Difference referred to above, preceded the translation of this key Laruellian text. For, although not without its problems, there is a core of highly original and powerful thought in Laruelle's writing, one which both Mullarkey and Brassier have been sensitive to, a core which is perhaps not so opaque and difficult after all and which is systematically presented in this work. This core of Laruellian thought could best be summed up in relation to two moments: on the one hand, an affirmation of radical immanence, what Laruelle dubs the 'vision-in-One' and whose axioms and deductions will propel the formation of non-philosophy as such, and, on the other, a diagnosis of the inner structure or governing code of philosophy as such, that is to say, philosophy identified in its most general identity and as that in relation to which non-philosophy will come to define itself.

Taking first the affirmation of radical immanence, it might simply be said that, for Laruelle, the 'One' is the real. The One is that which is immanent to all that exists or is, and therefore to all instances of world or of lived life. It is that dimension which, like the Lacanian Real, is beneath or which indwells within the realm of phenomenal appearance and within all that is accessible via the transcendence of consciousness and world. Decisively for Laruelle, he begins from the axiom that the One, as One, is absolutely autonomous, undivided, and indeed indivisible, and therefore of itself entirely indifferent and resistant to conceptual transcendence, to its reflection into conceptual determination or representation. In Kantian terms the One could be aligned with the noumenal realm in the sense that it is inaccessible to both experience and pure understanding. Put in quasi-Hegelian terms, the One of the real, in its autonomy and indivisibility, resists, absolutely and without remainder, the labour of the concept; it resists all negation, splitting or scission by the dialectical operations of conceptual determination, and does so in such a way that immanence remains radically in excess of all human categorization and cognition. The One of the real, then, is absolutely unknowable.

At the same time Laruelle takes what might be described as a structural approach to philosophy as a whole: he seeks to define philosophy systematically according to what he sees as its invariant and irreducible structure. According to this account philosophy as philosophy, whether in the forms of ontology, epistemology, logic, or in the modes of idealism, empiricism, phenomenology, realism, or indeed any other position including recent French philosophies of difference, is, for Laruelle, always, in one way or another, engaged in operations of conceptual transcendence which supervene upon immanence. The constant or invariant structure that he identifies is one in which immanence and transcendence are first posed by philosophy and then immanence is subjected to a form of 'capture' by the transcendence of conceptual determination. In this way immanence and transcendence are 'mixed', and this mixture is 'synthesized' into a whole. This whole would be philosophy's determination of being taken together with its concomitant determination of the means by which being can be grounded or known, that is, its determination of truth, reason, logic and so on. Put differently philosophy poses 'being' or existence on the one hand and its representation in concepts or categories on the other, and it then constructs, or legislates for, the equivalence, identity, or unity of these in the universality of philosophical truths and foundations. Philosophy thus positions itself as the unifying transcendent principle that governs the original division or opposition. In this way it also founds its own authority (in a circular manner, Laruelle argues) at the very same moment that it founds the 'truth' of being and existence. This internal and invariant structure Laruelle refers to as the 'philosophical decision'.  He refers to philosophy's power of auto-legislation and auto-positioning in relation to being and truth as the Principle of Sufficient Philosophy or PSP.

Yet, when viewed in the light of the vision-in-One, the whole or totality that is produced by philosophy is nothing other than an illusion or mirage. From the axiom of the real's indivisibility and autonomy it would necessarily follow that the power of philosophical conceptuality to subject the One to the operations of splitting, division and synthesis is entirely illusory, as would be the power that philosophy reserves for itself to legislate for its own power of legislation (the PSP). Further the philosophical decision and the PSP emerge here as singularly violent operations that seek both to appropriate the inappropriable and to create a unitary and authoritarian discourse of Truth, which would police all other forms of knowledge and ways of being and doing. It is the characterization of the philosophical decision and the PSP as both illusory and authoritarian that leads Laruelle to demand a change of discourse, the creation and production of non-philosophy.

Laruelle describes non-philosophy in this work and elsewhere in terms of a 'global change of perspective' (p. 126). It is not the negation of philosophy but a science of philosophy in the sense that it gives us a rigorously formal definition of the structure of philosophy itself and a formal means of engaging with the materials of philosophy by way of a different structural gesture. Non-philosophy would be to philosophy, Laruelle tells us, as non-Euclidean geometries (Lobachevskian or Riemannian) would be to Euclidean geometries. The difficulty and complexity of Laruelle's thinking lie in the means by which he seeks to accomplish this different structural gesture and thereby to achieve the 'non-' of non-philosophy. What is very clear though is that the mutation, practice and pragmatics of non-philosophical thinking as developed in this work follow rigorously from the founding axiom of the vision-in-One. For, if non-philosophy, like philosophy, cannot appropriate or start with the One as a positive concept or content for its practice, all it can do is use or borrow the materials of philosophy in such a way that they are altered in their inner structure or logic.

Different philosophies, according to Laruelle, will necessarily make the philosophical decision differently. They will decide on the specific mode of mixing and synthesising immanence and transcendence in different ways and come to different formulations on the nature and interrelation of being and truth, thought and knowledge, and so on. They will also, of course, have a conflictual and more or less intolerant relation to each other, since each will necessarily hold its own decision to be the correct one and the PSP of each will exclude those of other philosophies, as each legislates in favour of itself as the ultimate mode of truth or knowledge of being. From Laruelle's perspective, all philosophies exist on a plane of equivalence in relation to the One of the real, that is to say, they all and equally have no purchase upon it whatsoever. They may have stark differences in relation to the way they configure the instances of being, world, consciousness, truth, etc. and their interrelation, but the vision-in-One necessarily poses them as equivalent in relation to absolute immanence.

Yet, despite having no knowledge of the real, different philosophical systems, and the discursive materials of which they are constituted, are at the same time 'of' the real, that is to say, the real is necessarily immanent to them and is their ultimate cause or determination. This is perhaps the most significant and original moment in Laruelle's thinking. Given this immanence of the real to all thought, different philosophies and their different philosophical decisions can always be placed back in relation to the real which, as he will later come to say, is their cause and determines them in the last instance. Non-philosophy here emerges as the use of philosophical materials in such a way that they are treated in equivalence in relation to the real and are shorn of the operations of transcendence with which they are endowed by the philosophical decision. In this way the philosophical decision is replaced, and philosophical discourse is set into a different relation to the real. Philosophical discourse is 'emplaced' alongside or 'with its real base or the base of the last instance' (p. 247) that is the immanence of the real itself.

As has already been suggested, the difficultly in Laruelle's thought lies in the complexity of this gesture by which a different, non-conceptual and non-appropriative relation to the One is established by non-philosophical discourse. Standing back from all this, a number of remarks might be made.

Firstly, Laruelle can easily be criticised for having an all too general and totalizing definition of philosophy. In this sense the very totalising gesture he ascribes to philosophical discourse could be said to be a defining characteristic of his own structural approach to philosophy as a whole. Here, then, it would not be philosophy (which is evidently so plural) but Laruelle himself who is guilty of totalising. Brassier has identified this problem very well and has responded by suggesting that, although Laruelle's attempt to define philosophy as such and as a whole is implausibly totalising, it does nevertheless identify the inner structure of post-Kantian idealist philosophy and its avatars. On this basis, Brassier identifies Laruelle as a key resource for identifying a certain post-Kantian legacy and moving beyond it.

Yet even if one does accept Laruelle's account of philosophy as being governed by the philosophical decision, the PSP, and therefore as enacting itself always as an authoritarian and totalising discourse, questions may still arise as to the nature and status of non-philosophy itself. Laruelle states that the mutation of philosophy into non-philosophy 'implies the invention of new expressions, practices, writings, possibilities' (p. 126). Non-philosophy is liberating, democratising and a universal creative principle within thought because it unshackles us from the authoritarian and unitary mode of philosophy. Thus Laruelle is able to write: 'Philosophy can only really become "for all" or "popular" by becoming non-philosophy' (p. 28). Non-philosophy sets itself up as a thinking in which 'ordinary man' is not alienated but liberated, not subjugated to the unitary philosophical determinations of being and truth, but freed to invent on a plane of equivalence in relation to the unknowable and indivisible One. Yet this affirmation of democracy, populism and a discursive practice open to all stands in stark contrast with the difficulty and opaqueness of Laruelle's own non-philosophical practice. The torsions of language, neologisms, and the complexities of rhetorical performance he stages in order to articulate the 'non-' of non-philosophical discourse arguably make his writing at times more inaccessible than almost any other form of discourse one is likely to come across. Recent works such as Philosophie non-standard only serve to exacerbate this problem in the extreme and make one wonder just what future non-philosophical production will look like and whether it can ever be liberating in the sense that Laruelle seems to hope for.

Yet within all this difficulty a powerful thinking of immanence has emerged, one in which the real emerges, not as something to be determined by thought, but as something that is always already and in the last instance the cause or determination of thought, of consciousness, world and all that is. There is a powerful reversal of Kantianism at work here that both Mullarkey and Brassier have identified and that may yet prove to be a huge resource for future thinking, and could certainly rival or exceed the power of similar claims made by, say, Alain Badiou or Quentin Meillassoux. Yet given the difficulty of non-philosophy such as it has been elaborated to date in much of Laruelle's work, it remains unclear as to how this 'mutation of philosophy' will realise its transformative ambition and potential.