Philosophy and Psychiatry: Problems, Intersections, and New Perspectives

Placeholder book cover

Daniel D. Moseley and Gary J. Gala (eds.), Philosophy and Psychiatry: Problems, Intersections, and New Perspectives, Routledge, 2016, 304pp., $148.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415708166.

Reviewed by Timothy Joseph Lane, Taipei Medical University


If we already had a periodic table of mental illness in hand, there would be less need for a book of this type. Although some psychiatrists do think of themselves as chemists, the analogy is without warrant. Not only does psychiatry lack an analogue of the periodic table, its principal tool -- the Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders (DSM) -- is a contentious document. Even subsequent to the publication of DSM-III in 1980, which was intended to serve as an operational guideline for clinical practice, it and its heirs (DSM-V was published in 2013) have often fueled rather than quelled controversy. Although beginning with that third major revision of DSM a concerted effort has been made to ensure greater consistency in diagnoses, psychiatry remains beset by concerns that it is insufficiently scientific, unduly influenced by the pharmaceutical industry, indecisive as to whether it should focus on the mind or the brain, incapable of distinguishing among types of diseases, inclined to expand illness criteria without adequate justification, overly reliant on subjective judgments, wont to conflate clinical and ethical judgments, and engaged in indiscriminate use of psychoactive drugs. These worries concerning its scientific and ethical status are among the reasons that psychiatry attracts the attention of philosophers.

Although these worries incline some to think that modern psychiatry is in a hopeless muddle, perspective is needed. Psychiatry might never be replaced by neurology or neuroscience, but 21st-century clinicians provide much better treatments than were on offer in previous centuries. As many among the authors in this volume make clear, a principal difficulty confronted by psychiatry is that it remains wedded to a nosology of signs and symptoms, or diagnostic criteria, and that it lacks biomarkers. But it is equally clear that the importance of those criteria should not be taken lightly: in the 21st century they are part of a rough-and-ready arsenal whereby treatment for mental disorders can be bootstrapped from primitive rituals to the discovery of extremely effective, biomarker-guided, therapeutic treatments. To cite just one example, in 2007 anti-NMDA receptor encephalitis, manifestations of which were once regarded as indicating demonic possession, was finally identified as an autoimmune disorder, and it is now an eminently treatable disease (Sébire 2010, Cahalan 2012). The discovery that a majority of these patients respond well to immunotherapy was in no small measure facilitated by the meticulous description of psychiatric symptoms recorded in DSM (Barry et al. 2015). However the authors who have contributed to this book regard contemporary psychiatry and its engagement with philosophy, no one among them yearns for return to a time when symptoms and signs were regarded with less consistency, treated less systematically, or divorced from a search for biomarkers.

The editors, Daniel D. Moseley and Gary J. Gala, pitch the book as consisting of three types of conversation. Part I focuses on philosophy of psychiatry: the application of philosophical methods to psychopathology as well as mental health research, services, law and policy. Part II focuses on philosophy in psychiatry: reflection on assumptions that are commonplace in psychiatric method, research, and practice. Part III focuses on philosophy out of psychiatry: attempts to derive insights from psychiatric practice that can inform reflection on philosophical issues. This distinction-by-preposition, however, reflects more an ambition than a substantive difference in content. Indeed, the imbricate relationship of Parts I and II indicates the degree to which both address psychiatry's struggle to refine DSM and tease out its ethical implications. Parts I and II are also alike in structure; both comprise four paired essays, lead and commentary. Part III, however, comprises only two paired essays, one of which deals with psychiatry just tangentially. For some of the issues covered, psychiatrists take the lead and philosophers comment; for others, the order is reversed. By and large, commentaries are designed to amend or extend, rather than incite controversy. Nevertheless, disciplinary differences being what they are, psychiatrists often find fault with the philosophers for their scientific or clinical naiveté, and philosophers find fault with psychiatrists for their unwieldy application of conceptual scalpels.

Nicholas Kontos begins Part I by reminding readers of the "imperative to act" (p. 7): when clinicians treat suicidal patients, there is no time to engage in deep reflection on the scientific or ethical status of DSM. Real time for clinicians is calculated in seconds; so aspiring for a scientific theory that asymptotically approaches the truth about mental illness, or mulling over the ethical significance of therapeutic interventions, are necessarily reserved for off-duty hours. Philosophers, however, are expected to engage in these reflections while they are on the job. Of course this distinction should be obvious, but it is important that critics of DSM keep in mind that rational deliberation in the clinic cannot be the same as rational deliberation in the philosopher's cloister.

Kontos's principal concern is with "psychological symptom amplification" (PSA), the idea that psychological symptoms are no less subject to distortion than are somatic symptoms. Patients often give pathological interpretations of their experiences, interpretations taken at face value by clinicians and that influence a patient's sense of self in significant ways. For example, patients who believe that they suffer from bipolar disorder tend to regard themselves as mercurial and irresponsible, even if these dispositions are not caused by actual pathology. PSA presents a dilemma for the clinician: to believe what a patient says can lead to misdiagnosis, but so too can the disinclination to believe. What is more, the seeming "invisibility" of PSA can also hinder psychiatry in its quest for scientific legitimacy; distinguishing the effects of placebos from antidepressants is difficult because distorting psychological symptoms confound data, "negatively skewing active drug response rates" (pp. 20-21).

Deriving lessons from the history of psychiatry, Justin Garson attempts to explain why PSA is invisible. He argues that prior to DSM III, psychiatrists tended to regard mental disorders as strategies deployed unconsciously "to cope with unpleasant situations" (p. 31). But through the 1970s and culminating with DSM III's publication, behaviorally and biologically attuned psychiatrists carried the day over those who favored psychodynamic approaches; this led to a shift from regarding mental disorders as strategies to seeing them as dysfunctions. From the post-DSM III perspective, just as no one would regard cancer as a patient's strategy for achieving an unconscious goal, neither should mental disorders be so regarded. The problem with this view is that it ignores the likelihood that some patients do indeed amplify symptoms in order to achieve particular ends, albeit non-consciously. The suggestion then seems to be that disorder-as-strategy should continue to play some role in psychiatric science and therapy.

Marc Lange's essay and the commentary by Abraham Nussbaum consider whether psychiatric diseases differ from somatic. Lange argues that diseases, mental and somatic, are both "natural kinds of incapacities" that play a role in functional explanations. Lange considers and rejects several rationales for distinguishing the mental from the somatic: both types of disease can be heterogeneous, have vague boundaries and multiple causes, and also require a social context. In short, what applies to the mind also applies to the body. Nussbaum, in his commentary, allows that mental diseases might be natural kinds, but sees them as distinct in one respect. He contends that mental disorders intrinsically involve incapacities of agency. The idea is that psychiatric patients "have an impaired ability to actuate their desires." For example, depressed persons are incapable of engaging in intentional actions that they enjoy, and those who suffer from alcohol use disorder lack the capacity to seek their own well-being (pp. 55-57).

The dialogue between Warren Kinghorn and Christian Perring reveals the degree to which DSM can be a flashpoint for controversy, though readers might wonder whether the heat derives more from a clashing of metaphors than from substantive disagreement. Kinghorn offers a defense of DSM that is atypical for a clinician: he defends it on moral grounds. He does not deny that it usefully organizes empirical research, reflects the collective judgments of American psychiatry, and provides a shared language for nosology and diagnosis. Nevertheless, despite its status as a unifying document, it is not objective, apolitical, or timeless. He holds that it is best understood when interpreted as "a moral document," more "genealogical" than "encyclopedic," that evolved within a particular socio-historical context as "a form of moral inquiry" (p. 66). The point is not that DSM is an account of how to live, per se. Rather, it defines normative parameters for what counts as a good life; in this way, it indicates when clinical intervention is needed. He speculates that this moral status has been conferred upon DSM because traditional institutions seem "increasingly tentative"; accordingly, DSM has evolved so as to fill the vacuum and "provide a comforting moral framework."

Perring doesn't buy this. He rejects the analogy to moral enquiry (p. 80). Perring does not deny that DSM's tradition is "checkered," but he takes seriously psychiatry's aim to categorize actual mental disorders, as well as identify their causes and optimal treatments. Moreover, despite its warts, DSM does allow for a "scientific piecemeal" approach, whereby diagnoses can be evaluated for reliability and validity vis-à-vis competitors, making progress in the understanding of pathology possible. Perring's preferred analogy is that DSM resembles a guide to edible plants; each edition improves upon its predecessors, and serves as a better guide to action. In the same way, DSM diagnoses and treatments can exhibit "piecemeal" improvements. Putting the tropes aside, however, what troubles Perring most is that Kinghorn believes we should "celebrate" DSM. Perring thinks this to be wrong-headed: rather than celebrate DSM, we should grimly acknowledge the lack of good alternatives, adopt a "critical and skeptical stance," and busy ourselves with piecemeal refinements.

Benjamin Kozuch and Michael McKenna's essay and the commentary by Chandra Sripada concern moral responsibility. Although I find the concept of "free will" that they invoke nonessential to their analyses, there is much to like here. Especially noteworthy is their decision not to focus on the dramatic cases that so often appear in discussions of free will; rather, they attend to more pedestrian, mild cases of generalized anxiety disorder, clinical depression, and attention deficit disorder. Their goal is to help show how mundane but widespread disorders can play a "non-trivial causal role," without necessarily undermining the status of these persons as morally responsible agents. Sripada endorses much that is written in the target essay, but distinguishes between being-in-control and the failure to express self in the actions one takes -- a failure to express one's concerns on matters of value. He argues that it should be the latter, not the former, which can serve "as the basis for excuse" (p. 115), for even if an action feels as though it eludes self-control, whether the action expresses who we are is a separate and morally more relevant issue.

As for Part II, philosophy in psychiatry, here too the issues are urgent, the exchanges constructive, and the essays well-executed. This sense of urgency is underscored by the special attention devoted to involuntary treatment. But the pivotal concerns from philosophy of psychiatry carry over. As the first pair of essays seems to imply, sound evaluation of distinct positions will turn largely on the future of DSM, how future editions are interpreted and, arguably of greater importance, the future of more recent initiatives, in particular the Research Domain Criteria (RDoC) -- an attempt begun in 2013 to construct a "periodic table" for mental illness, while also identifying genetic, biological and environmental factors that cause malfunction (pp. 155-156). Much of what can be said about the status of assumptions in psychiatry awaits progress in psychiatric science, progress that will also be subjected to investigations of psychopathology and mental health research. If significant scientific progress is in the offing, new departures and discoveries will motivate philosophical investigations of psychiatric science's evolving status, and these investigations will necessarily involve a rethinking of underlying assumptions. In short, although this volume is not explicit on this point, the tentative nature of many exchanges seems less a reflection of psychiatry's past antagonisms and more an anticipation of potential scientific game changers.

George Szmukler is concerned with assumptions concerning the imposition of involuntary treatment. Motivated by worries about discrimination against those who suffer from mental illness, he advocates a Fusion Law, "a single, generic statute, covering everyone" who suffers from an impairment of "decision-making capability" (DMC). Whether the impairment of DMC is due to a psychiatric disorder, a neurological disorder, an infection, or an adverse drug reaction is irrelevant. Under the Fusion Law, involuntary treatment could only be considered if a person suffers impairment to DMC and if it would be in the patient's best interest, without regard to the cause of the impairment. Ken Levy and Alex Cohen's principal objection is that Szmukler gives short shrift to the problem of non- or pre-criminal danger. Szmukler suggests that "danger" can be explicated with reference to the concept of "best interest," but he is silent as regards to how. Levy and Cohen correct for this omission, a critical one given its relevance for decisions concerning involuntary treatment, by incisively distinguishing among various types of danger -- infectious disease, suicide, and homicide -- usefully identifying many of the legal and empirical factors that are invoked to justify differential treatment.

Jesse S. Summers and Walter Sinnott-Armstrong stake out new territory, asking whether psychiatric treatment is warranted in cases where persons seem excessively concerned about morality. Their analysis targets "scrupulosity" which can be thought of as seeing sin where there is none or dwelling on minor issues while neglecting more important ones (p. 163). They construct a cogent argument for regarding scrupulosity not so much as a religious or moral problem; instead, they argue that it is better understood as a form of Obsessive-Compulsive Disorder. On this interpretation, they suggest that therapy is sometimes advisable in order to assuage anxiety and even, arguably, enhance the internal coherence of patients' moral and religious views (pp. 175-176). In her commentary, Hanna Pickard expresses concern that Summers and Sinnott-Armstrong might be suggesting treatment even when the scrupulous person objects, treatment that aims at changing beliefs and behavior, changes that would, from the first-person point of view, make the individual less moral (p. 184). Pickard adds that expecting internal coherence for moral or religious views should not be among the criteria used for assessing scrupulosity. Her reasoning is that even the less scrupulous among us would be hard pressed to present more than a "mish-mash" of poorly integrated beliefs.

Scott Kim, like Szmukler, is concerned with DMC. His project begins with the worry that DMC models attend to the ability to understand and express preferences, but they omit much that takes place in between -- e.g. authenticity assessments, emotive reactions, or valuation. His ambitious goal is to construct a comprehensive framework that reveals how these components fit together within an integrated process. In her commentary, Jennifer Hawkins endorses Kim's ambition and acknowledges that he is sensitive to the distinction between judging a person's values and judging the "ability to value." But she finds fault with his framework's management of this distinction. Whereas Kim strives to avoid saying "certain illnesses distort our values in ways that make them off-base, flawed, mistaken, or simply bad," Hawkins argues that adopting such positions is precisely what is called for, especially if we are to deal with the most important cases (p. 210).

Franklin Worrell and Alison Denham are concerned with Dissociative Identity Disorder (DID), holding that it can be genuine and is not necessarily iatrogenic. They take it for granted that some forms of dissociation (e.g., mind wandering while driving) are commonplace, but that something goes awry in DID patients, typically as the result of a traumatic experience, one that precipitates discontinuities in the sense of self and agency, discontinuities that are insulated by amnesic barriers. Their principal concern is to question whether the integration or fusion of distinct selves is "in every case a proper therapeutic goal" (p. 217). Invoking a notion that they dub "Sophoclean agency," they argue that to be divided is not necessarily a state we should seek to eliminate. They "take seriously the possibility that a better, more authentic . . . life may be had by multiple agents than by one who persists in reaching for a form of unity that lies beyond his grasp" (p. 234).

In his commentary, Richard Chefetz, reaches conclusions that do not differ from those of Worrell and Denham. But he rightly chides them for relying upon archaic, dramatic cases, and for failing to cite clinical data. He points out that disproportionate attention delivered to the sensational -- "multiple personality" -- aspects of DID tends to obscure "underlying ubiquitous dissociative processes" (p. 239). He avers that to better understand DID we need to understand how normally integrated neuronal functions can dissociate, and how such dissociation can cause depersonalization experiences. He does not deny that some people believe that other people live within them, but he regards this delusion to be derivative of insufficient "internally integrated experience" (p. 242). It seems that the belief that other people are living within oneself is an attitude adopted by patients in order to explain depersonalization, or poorly integrated experiences. As to whether integration is a proper therapeutic goal, Chefetz emphasizes that determination in any given case should result from a "relational" view of psychology, which is a view that does not privilege the clinician's knowledge and that leaves open the possibility of multiple selves living flexibly, without dissociative disruption.

In Part III, David Rubinow asks: why do people respond differently to the same stimuli? Taking the effects of reproductive steroids on affective regulation as an example, he provides a meticulous characterization of endocrine-related mood disorders. Throughout, he emphasizes the importance of context: critical periods, age, timing, and different hormonal states all play roles in determining sensitivity or susceptibility. To illustrate how much context matters, he observes that a genetic female salmon can be transformed into a functioning male, simply by exposing it to two hours of an aromatic inhibitor, which prevents conversion of testosterone to estradiol. His main point is that failure to study the interplay of genotype, cognition, behavior, and hormonal activity yields conclusions about behavioral phenotypes that are likely to be erroneous, a fact that should matter as much in the clinic as in basic science. In her commentary, Valerie Hardcastle adds yet another layer of complexity: where Rubinow goes small, e.g. discussing the presence of a single nucleotide and the increased likelihood of mortality among the depressed, Hardcastle goes large, emphasizing that change in neighborhood, e.g. the world of the urban poor, can play a role that is no less vital. She observes that overblown expectations for the Human Genome Project -- that in the 21st century it would significantly reduce the pernicious effects of major diseases -- have gone unrealized, due in large part to neglect of the role played by knowledge, neighborhood, and lifestyle. Strikingly, this is no less true for mental health disorders than it is for, say, cardiovascular problems; indeed, by the year 2020, Major Depressive Disorder is projected to be the second leading cause of disability, worldwide, and social factors are among the major reasons for this. Although Hardcastle does not mention it, her essay makes the 19th century sociologist Émile Durkheim's work on suicide seem not only prescient, but also highly relevant to basic research and clinical practice of the 21st century.

On balance, this is an excellent collection, one that can serve as a model for constructive dialogue between those charged with the imperative to act in clinical time and those whose job it is to reflect in philosophical time. Most of the lead essays raise important issues, both lucidly and cogently. In turn, most of the commentaries amend or complement, effectively and incisively. What I do find a bit disappointing, however, is that some issues are tantalizingly on display but left, regrettably, unexplored. One among these is the relationship between initiatives like the Research Domain Criteria (RDoC) and DSM. Not unlike Gothic architecture, now that DSM has reached a definitive form, its "progress" seems to rely on ever-increasing internal complexity. The worry is not that this complexity is lacking clinical import; instead, it is that these intricacies might be of a sort that hinder rather than promote scientific progress. It might not be far-fetched to expect that neuroscience will witness a revolution similar to that which visited chemistry and physics in the latter part of the 19th and the early part of the 20th centuries, a revolution that would transform psychiatry. Even if such a revolution is beyond our reach, however, I would have found an assiduous attempt to situate DSM-V in the context of RDoC-inspired 21st-century neuroscience helpful in trying to assess its scientific and ethical status.


I gratefully acknowledge the institutional support of Taipei Medical University's Research Center for Brain and Consciousness, Graduate Institute of Humanities in Medicine, and Shuang-Ho Hospital; Academia Sinica's Institute of European and American Studies; and, National Chengchi University's Research Center for Mind, Brain, and Learning. Financial support for his research is provided by grants from Taiwan's Ministry of Science and Technology: 102-2420-H-038-001-MY3, 104-2420-H-038-001-MY3, 105-2410-H-038-004-MY, and 105-2632-H-038-001-MY3.


Barry, H. et al. (2015) Anti-N-methyl-D-aspartate receptor encephalitis: review of clinical presentation, diagnosis and treatment. BJPscyh Bulletin 39, 1, 19-23.

Cahalan, S. (2012). Brain on fire. Simon and Schuster.

Sébire, G. (2010). In search of lost time from "Demonic Possession" to anti -- N-methyl-D-aspartate receptor encephalitis. Annals of Neurology 67, 141 -- 142. doi:10.1002/ana.21928