Philosophy and Psychology of Time

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Bruno Mölder, Valtteri Arstila, and Peter Øhrstrøm (eds.), Philosophy and Psychology of Time, Springer, 2015, 271pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319221946.

Reviewed by Carlos Montemayor, San Francisco State University


The psychology of time has been a rapidly growing area of research for at least the last two decades. Experiments on how humans and animals keep track of time have produced impressive amounts of evidence. In studies with animals, findings suggest that there are non-linguistic forms of timing for action and motor control. Research on humans demonstrates that there are different stages involved in time perception and cognition, from within sense-modality and cross modal simultaneity to temporal order judgments and duration perception. A comprehensive theory of these findings requires an interdisciplinary approach, and various efforts to achieve this goal are underway, including the publication of an interdisciplinary journal exclusively devoted to timing and time perception in 2013.

Most philosophers of time have focused on the physics or metaphysics of time. Their approach, moreover, has been almost entirely restricted to a debate between the so called A and B theorists (A theorists believe that any event is fundamentally either present, past or future, while B theorists believe events are not fundamentally present, past or future, but only relatively simultaneous, precedent or subsequent).This book attempts to integrate philosophical and psychological approaches by enriching the set of issues for possible interaction between these disciplines. It does so by concentrating on the following perspectives: computational, psychological, phenomenological, logical, and epistemic. While these developments are welcome the authors and editors might, as I hope to show, have offered a more integrative treatment of recent psychological theories.

The book contains twelve articles organized in five parts. Part 1, "The Concept of Time in Philosophy and Psychology" contains articles on logical conceptions (Peter Øhrstrøm), folk conceptions (Samuel Baron and Kristie Miller) and psychological conceptions (Dan Zakay). Part 2, "Presence" contains two articles on the topic, by a philosopher (Sean Enda Power) and a psychologist (Marc Wittmann). Part 3, "Continuity and Flow of Time in Mind" examines the issue of temporal flow with essays by Oliver Rashbrook-Cooper, who offers a philosophical perspective on the stream of consciousness, and by Tamas Madl, Stan Franklin, Javier Snaider and Usef Faghihi, who offer a cognitive science perspective that includes computer science.

Parts 4 and 5 continue with this interdisciplinary approach. Part 4, "The Timing of Experiences" analyzes how to make extant philosophical models compatible with the scientific evidence (Valtteri Arstila) and how to develop models for time perception that are firmly based in brain time (Kielan Yarrow and Derek H. Arnold). In a particularly unusual area for philosophers to explore, part 5, "Time and Intersubjectivity" analyzes the social dimensions of time. Bruno Mölder applies a model of scientific explanation to temporal intersubjective processes and conditions, including mother-infant interactions, and phenomenological accounts of schizophrenia and depression. Colwyn Trevarthen, in the last essay of the book, provides a comprehensive presentation of a theoretical approach based on the dynamic involvement of agents in intersubjective communication and interaction. Time perception in agency and intersubjectivity is a topic that has not received the attention it deserves in the philosophy of time, and to some degree, even in the psychology of time. The editors of this volume chose wisely when they decided to devote a whole section of the book to it.

I found the chapters by Arstila, Rashbrook-Cooper, and Wittmann to be the most promising because of their originality and implications for the philosophy and psychology of time. Arstila offers a thorough examination of the extant proposals for the timing of experiences. His main conclusion is that a careful assessment of the contemporary proposals shows that psychologists focus on relations that match contents to neural and external events, such as simultaneity or temporal order, and that philosophers tend to assume the doctrine of the specious present as fundamental to our understanding of temporal experience, focusing mostly on apparent motion effects. These different approaches create an apparent impasse that Arstila proposes to overcome with a model that explains the phenomenology of temporal experience without necessitating the doctrine of the specious present. Although I am not entirely convinced by this proposal, I found the overall discussion useful and insightful.

Rashbrook-Cooper examines views on the flow of time, including Barry Dainton's influential work on this topic. The chapter raises objections to a characterization of the nature of the stream of consciousness as being continuous in virtue of its essentially lacking gaps. Rashbrook-Cooper convincingly argues that the 'gapless' view of the stream of consciousness generates empirical problems, as well as the possibility that the continuous stream of consciousness is illusory. Based on a distinction between phenomenal flow and phenomenal continuity, the paper concludes with a defense of extensionalism that does not endorse the gapless view. This chapter also presents an interesting challenge against atomism (the view that experiences have no explanatorily fundamental duration). The challenge against atomism is pressing because it is based on seemingly uncontroversial observations about introspection.

Wittmann distinguishes three types of present. His proposal is compellingly presented and grounded on psychological findings. A particularly promising theme of this chapter is what Wittmann calls 'mental presence.' Although it is not immediately experienced, mental presence integrates experienced moments in time into a cohesive narrative. This proposal moves beyond the traditional approach of understanding the present in terms of a single mapping between psychological time and external events. This kind of presence, therefore, is unique because it has clear implications for social time. Future research in philosophy and psychology should shed light on this type of presence required for social attention and interaction.

The volume as a whole is a defense of the claim that new approaches must be developed to fully understand the complexities of time in philosophy and psychology, and this is a proposal that should be encouraged, and which I certainly endorse. Integrating philosophy and psychology is essential if progress is to be made in understanding the relation between sensory time perception and more complex forms of time cognition, including social time. In this spirit, however, the volume disappoints, as key issues remain unexplored.

Given the amount of research on time perception and temporal experience one should not expect a fully comprehensive treatment of these topics in a volume that aims at presenting a variety of theoretical approaches. Nonetheless, there are two themes that would have made the book more cohesive had they been considered less peripherally. One of them is the complex issue of how perceived duration is integrated with perceived simultaneity. There are very pertinent discussions throughout the book about the duration of the specious present, models for timing, and original contributions about presence and the flow of time. But a more deliberate effort to evaluate these approaches in terms of how well they deal with this issue (i.e., how they could account for research on simultaneity windows and cognitive clocks) would have related the five parts of the book more systematically.

Admittedly, models of cognitive clocks are controversial, and interpreting the research on interval timing as confirming the existence of cognitive clocks is also controversial. Yet, the empirical evidence on clocks and interval timing deserves a more explicit discussion than it receives in the volume. Vast areas of the psychology of time focus on interval timing, specifically on how perceptual information is integrated by a time-keeping system, using behavioral and neuroscientific methods (Meck, 2003). A lot of this research is based on experiments involving animals. Relevant to this topic is the relation between circadian time-keeping (a clock with a long 24 hour period) and interval time-keeping (a clock with a much shorter duration, perhaps from milliseconds to a few seconds). Results confirming accurate timing across species also show that representations from these timing systems can be integrated with spatial and numerical information (for a classic review see Gallistel, 1990). This evidence strongly suggests that there are non-linguistic types of time perception, perhaps the most fundamental ones, which is another topic that could have been highlighted in the book. The findings on the clocks, therefore, should be integrated with a unified theory of time perception that could potentially be based on some of the models discussed in the volume. An important task will be to determine which models are compatible with this evidence.

Another area of research that focuses exclusively on humans concerns findings on simultaneity windows. Similarly to the evidence on time-keeping and perceived duration, there are different models for how the brain manages to integrate cross-modal simultaneity (i.e., simultaneity of percepts from different sense modalities). A more explicit and sustained discussion of these findings would have helped identify distinct ways of integrating the models and proposals of the book. For example, understanding how the interval system interacts with the cross-modal simultaneity system may shed light on how to integrate psychological conceptions of time with philosophical proposals on flow and temporal consciousness. This is clearly a very difficult task and much more needs to be done in order to arrive at a model of time perception that includes motor-control, conscious experience and agency. Although some attempts have been made to integrate the research on the clocks with the findings on simultaneity windows and conscious presence (see Montemayor, 2013), this is clearly a critical area of investigation for future research, which could have been highlighted more prominently in the book.

A second theme with the potential of integrating the five parts of the book is the relation between time perception and perceived causality. There is clearly a conceptual relation between time and causality, but there must also be a deeper cognitive relation between memory, time-keeping and causality (see Campbell, 1995). A more explicit discussion of this cognitive relation would have helped elucidate the connection between the five parts of the book. Relevant questions about this issue concern the relation between phenomenological approaches and the psychological models discussed in the book. More specifically, the topic of whether perceived causality or perceived agency are required for cross-modal simultaneity is an important focus of contemporary research that could have provided a more systematic structure to the chapters. I emphasize this issue in my assessment of part 5 below.

The book does, however, provide some insights regarding how to achieve a more cohesive and integrative perspective in parts 1 and 5. Øhrstrøm's references to the work of Julius Thomas Fraser (1978) are especially welcome because he uses Fraser's work to argue that we should not adopt a monolithic conception of time and then attempt to apply it to different disciplines. Rather, Øhrstrøm explains that distinct conceptions must play different roles in our understanding of the phenomenon that we globally call 'time.' I endorse this suggestion, but it immediately presents new problems. What is the relation between these different conceptions?

The two other papers in part 1 succeed in offering a cohesive and integrative perspective. Baron and Miller argue that our folk conception of time is a functional one, a particularly flexible one, compatible with the various conceptions described by Øhrstrøm. This suggests that epistemic, psychological and metaphysical approaches may demand different conceptions of time, thereby moving beyond the A and B series dichotomy. Zakay, by contrast, focuses on the distinction between physical and psychological time and offers an insightful discussion regarding their possible relation, emphasizing distinct functions of psychological time, including attention to time. Attention and time are central to our understanding of the relationship between time perception and agency (see Phillips [2012] for a philosophical appraisal of the relevant literature on attention to time), and it may prove critical to integrating duration and simultaneity perception. Part 1 of the book, therefore, can be considered as an interdisciplinary effort at integrating different views on time, including those presented in other chapters.

Part 5, on time and intersubjectivity, addresses the demand for concrete models that could implement a specific conception of time. As mentioned, I focus on this part of the book because intersubjectivity and time are rarely considered in the philosophy of time. On the one hand, Mölder presents a model of intersubjective time based on a model of scientific explanation. Such a model distinguishes between causal relevance, constitutive relevance, temporal constraints and background conditions, which are applied to different psychological phenomena, including psychopathologies. On the other hand, Trevarthen emphasizes the importance of agency, as well as a sense of purpose and motivation, including bodily emotional purpose, in his insightful proposal for intersubjective time. Although it is unclear whether these two models are incompatible, there could be obvious tensions between them because causal explanation does not suffice to account for agency. Here again, it is important to investigate, for future research, whether there is opposition between different levels of temporality or whether these levels are integrated in a unified or emergent framework (see Montemayor, 2010). Regardless of how this issue is resolved, opening new areas of inquiry in the philosophy of time and intersubjectivity is a welcome contribution of this section and of the book as a whole.

To conclude, this edited collection presents an impressive array of approaches, from the phenomenological to the computational, and it demonstrates the need for a more comprehensive theoretical perspective on the complexities of temporal cognition, which we currently lack. Future research will certainly benefit from this useful collection and hopefully generate more integrative accounts.


Campbell, John. 1995. Past, Space, and Self. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Fraser, J. T. 1978. "The Individual and Society." In J. T. Fraser, N. Lawrence and D. Park. The Study of Time III. New York: Springer: 419-442.

Gallistel, C. R. 1990. The Organization of Learning. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Meck, W. H. 2003. (Ed.) Functional and Neural Mechanisms of Interval Timing (Methods and New Frontiers in Neuroscience). Boca Raton, FL: CRC Press.

Montemayor, Carlos. 2013. Minding Time: A Philosophical and Theoretical Approach to the Psychology of Time. Boston: Brill.

Montemayor, Carlos. 2010. "Time: Biological, Intentional and Cultural." In J. A. Parker, P. Harris, and C. Steineck (Eds.), Time: Limits and Constraints. Leiden, The Netherlands: Brill: 39-63.

Phillips, Ian. 2012. Attention to the Passage of Time. Philosophical Perspectives, 26(1): 277-308.