Philosophy and Real Politics

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Raymond Geuss, Philosophy and Real Politics, Princeton University Press, 2008, 126pp., $19.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691137889.

Reviewed by Thomas Hurka, University of Toronto


In this short book, which expands a lecture he gave in Athens in 2007, Raymond Geuss defends a "realist" approach to political philosophy against an "ethics-first" view that he sees dominating contemporary analytic work in the field. On the latter view political philosophy starts by stating universal normative principles that are independent of the facts about any particular political agent or society; those facts become relevant only when the principles are applied to particular cases. Geuss takes Nozick and Rawls to typify the ethics-first view and subjects their work to vigorous and even belligerent criticism. But his own realist view doesn't emerge as a clear philosophical alternative.

The ethics-first view rests on a sharp distinction between 'is' and 'ought': the reason ultimate normative principles can't be based on facts about particular societies is that they can't be based on any non-normative facts. Geuss rejects any such sharp distinction, and this gives his realist view a very wide-ranging content. He discusses not only the normative issues addressed by Nozick and Rawls but also explanatory issues about why societies behave politically as they do. And it's here, Geuss says, that his realist view makes many of its distinctive claims.

Realist political philosophy doesn't exaggerate how far political agents have been and are influenced by fully worked-out ethical conceptions. It recognizes that they have ethical beliefs, but it sees these as loosely structured and changeable, with an at best sporadic influence on agents' behaviour. For realists the central explanatory concept is that of power. To understand political events it's less important to analyze people's ethical beliefs than to examine the power-relations among them and to ask, following Lenin, "Who does what to whom for whose benefit?" We must also be constantly alert for cases of ideology, where political beliefs are formed and sustained only because they serve the interests of powerful groups.

Geuss contrasts these realist ideas with the ethics-first view, but these ideas seem orthogonal to the latter's main concerns, which as normative imply no particular conclusions about why agents act as they do. Just as the view's proponents don't derive an 'ought' from an 'is,' so they don't derive an 'is' from an 'ought.' The Kantian strain in recent political philosophy, represented by Rawls and his followers, does tend to high-mindedness about political agency, holding that citizens should and therefore can be motivated largely by normative beliefs: see, for example, Rawls's publicity condition and the whole literature on deliberative democracy. But an ethics-first view can just as well be hard-headed about how agents act. It can hold that timeless principles of justice applied in a given society mandate a system of publicly funded health care. But it can recognize that the better-off members of this society won't support the system just because they see that it's just; they need self-interested incentives. So the society may want to make the system universal, giving benefits even to people who don't need them, and to make it hard for those people to know the system's real net cost to them. If so, the society is partly realist about political actors while remaining ethics-first about principles.

Geuss's more relevant opposition to the ethics-first view starts with his denial that there are universal ethical principles. This may be plausible for concrete principles such as "Every society should be a representative democracy," but Geuss gives little reason to extend it to more abstract ones such as "It's bad if people suffer, and other things equal society should do what it can to prevent suffering" (hardly trivial in its practical implications). Why can't this principle be true in all societies everywhere? Why must we look at the details of Afghan history and culture to know whether it's bad if Afghans suffer? Preventing suffering may rightly be a lower priority in some societies than in others, for example, ones living in harsh conditions like those of the Inuit in the pre-contact Arctic. But the principle about suffering may be only one ultimate principle among several, with its weight against the others depending on how urgent a given situation makes the others' demands. Geuss himself affirms a plurality of ultimate principles, against Rawls, but a non-Rawlsian ethics-first view can do the same, so its principle says only that other things equal society should relieve suffering. Why can't that be true universally?

Moreover, it's unclear exactly how Geuss's own view avoids universal principles. The difficulty emerges in his critique of Nozick.

Geuss devotes almost all his critique to the first sentence of Anarchy, State, and Utopia: "Individuals have rights, and there are things no person or group may do to them (without violating their rights)." He comments that Nozick "allows that bald statement to lie flapping and gasping for breath like a large, moribund fish on the deck of a trawler, with no further analysis or discussion, and proceeds to draw conclusions from it" (p. 64). The prose here is pungent but its point is less than compelling.

First, contra Geuss (and Bentham), there's no logical difficulty about rights being ethically basic, because claims about rights are equivalent to ones about permissions and duties. If I have a right to life, then I'm morally permitted to choose to live rather than die, others are forbidden to prevent me from so choosing (as they do if they kill me without my consent), and I and others are permitted to use coercion to enforce that prohibition. There's no reason in principle why this package of claims can't be underivatively true, and true even in societies where people don't believe they're true or haven't joined them together under the single concept of a right.

More important, however, is what Geuss offers as a positive alternative to Nozick. He says we have to ask why, in any given society, it's "(objectively) right" or "makes sense" to assign a particular bundle of freedoms, powers, and immunities to individuals (p. 67). But how exactly do we do this? Geuss has excluded the simplest answer to his question: that assigning this bundle recognizes and substantiates moral rights all persons everywhere have. So perhaps we have to appeal to some principle that uses a different concept, saying, for example, that granting this bundle will help satisfy people's needs. But won't the question then arise why in this society it "makes sense" to use that particular concept of needs? And if we answer using some yet further concept, won't the same question arise and keep arising to infinity? It seems the only way to avoid a regress here is to at some point use a principle that doesn't need special justification in this society because it holds universally -- but that's to revert to the ethics-first view.

Or perhaps we're meant to just "see," without using any principle, that a certain bundle of rights or concept of needs "makes sense" in a given society. But then how can we explain why it makes sense? Doesn't that require showing how some more basic considerations that might support a different conclusion in different conditions support this conclusion here? Without that demonstration, Geuss's talk of "making sense" seems a mystery. Yet with it we're back at ethics first.

Geuss's book is short, and near its end he says, quite reasonably, that he can't be expected to develop a full positive alternative to the view he's attacking . But surely he has to show how an alternative to that view is at least possible, which in his case means showing how we can identify the "right" principles for a given society without making ethics-first claims. Nowhere in Philosophy and Real Politics is that ever really done.

Like his critique of Nozick, Geuss's critique of Rawls reaches a rhetorical high pitch: "The often noted absence in Rawls of any theory of how his ideal demands are to be implemented is not a tiny mole that serves as a beauty spot to set off the radiance of the rest of the face, but the epidermal sign of a lethal tumour" (p. 94). Many of his criticisms concern the details of Rawls's original-position argument; for example, that Rawls doesn't let his contractors know what further evils can flow from the ways extreme wealth gets used in capitalist societies. But let me avoid the most boring topic in all political philosophy -- how some critic of Rawls misunderstands Rawls -- to look at a more serious methodological criticism Geuss makes.

This concerns the weight Rawls and ethics-first philosophers generally place on "intuitive" moral judgements, and the danger this brings of ideology. Why think that our immediate judgements about justice and similar concepts are insights into universal ethical truth rather than replications of ideas created and maintained to serve the interests of powerful people? A political philosophy founded on intuitions will too often be parochial and conservative, offering high-flown justifications for the status quo rather than any serious challenge to it. Geuss thinks both Nozick's and Rawls's theories succumb to this danger.

There's much to this criticism, and political philosophy even more than ethics narrowly construed must carefully scrutinize the origins of any supposed intuitions it appeals to. But this is something the best ethics-first philosophers have always recognized. Henry Sidgwick said the fact that we think we're intuiting a self-evident truth doesn't at all mean we are; we may just be repeating an opinion that frequent hearing has made look self-evident. Sidgwick wasn't here thinking specifically of ideology; he didn't have that concept. But he too was warning against too-easy appeals to "intuition."

But what do we do with this warning? Sidgwick thought it could only lead to more self-consciousness in our use of intuition, because there's no other route to moral truth than the intuitive one. (This may mean more focus on abstract principles, if judgements about them are less likely to be socially influenced than ones about particular acts.) And surely the fact that an ethical judgement has social causes doesn't by itself show that it is false or point us to a better alternative. We need an independent demonstration that some different judgement is true. Sidgwick thought that demonstration could only come from other, better intuitions.

Of course, Geuss wants something more radical; he wants the suspect nature of moral intuition to point to his entirely different "realist" political philosophy. But his book disappoints because it never clearly shows how its proposed realist methodology will work, or how a philosophy based on it can reach credible political conclusions without making just the ethics-first assumptions it claims to avoid. Geuss is understandably repelled by the high-mindedness and abstraction of much current political philosophy, but his excessive focus on Rawls and Kantianism more generally prevents him from seeing that many of his objections don't apply to non-Kantian views that still put ethics first. And his book suffers from its own kind of abstraction: describing its alternative philosophical methodology only in terms too general to show clearly how it will do things differently.