Philosophy and Religion

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Anthony O'Hear (ed.), Philosophy and Religion, Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplement 68, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 314pp., $32.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107615984.

Reviewed by John Cottingham, Heythrop College, University of London, and University of Reading


The Royal Institute of Philosophy lecture series is a regular feature of the philosophical calendar in London each year. The theme for the 2008-9 lectures was Religion, chosen, as editor Anthony O'Hear explains, in the light of the fierce public debates in this area over the past few years, and in an "attempt to throw light on the topic, rather than pour yet more oil on turgid waters" (p. 1). The editor appears to have taken a rather relaxed approach to the organizing of this particular set of lectures: rather than asking his speakers to offer their philosophical reflections on the current confrontation between atheists and theists, or to focus on specific topics of interest or difficulty in that debate, he seems (judging by the volume's contents) to have simply invited them to present any paper they happen to have been working on at the time in the general area of religion. The result is not so much a thematically linked collection as a highly heterogeneous hotchpotch.

This is not to say that there are not some very worthwhile and illuminating papers to be found here. Richard Swinburne, in the opening essay ("God as the Simplest Explanation of the Universe"), provides a lucid summary of his well-known probabilistic strategy in natural theology, claiming that "the hypothesis of theism . . . satisfies the criteria of correct explanation [simplicity and ability to account for the relevant data] better than does any rival explanation" (p. 11). Tim Mawson, whose approach to natural theology is very much in the Swinburnean mould, offers an unusual variant of the "fine-tuning" argument for theism -- one which focuses on the continuing tractability of the universe to our human processes of induction. Mawson argues that in the multiverse cosmology that is often presented as an alternative to theism there will be an infinitely low probability that any universe in which there are morally sensitive and significantly free persons will also be a universe which those persons can consistently understand through induction (p. 49).

Next, Gerard Hughes offers a self‑confessedly "modest" defence of the traditional cosmology that posits God to explain the existence and particular organization of the universe. The modesty of his defence turns out to be considerable, in so far as Hughes, while insisting that the theistic account is "reasonable", readily acknowledges that there are other reasonable views one can take, including certain types of atheism and agnosticism. He also concedes that positing God should not be supposed to make the origins of the universe clear, or enable us to grasp the sense in which the material world is thereby explained (p. 64). A long and highly intricate paper by Brian Leftow follows, entitled "One Step toward God", which develops a (modified) Augustinian strategy for arguing for God by showing how the inclusion of a theistic element might improve on a Platonist theory of attributes.

Also falling within the genre of mainstream philosophical theology is Robin Le Poidevin's paper on the Incarnation, where he wrestles with the long-debated paradox that Jesus Christ was both fully divine and also at the same time fully human. One possible solution on offer is the "divided mind" model (that the mind of Christ was composite, with both a human and a divine part), but Le Poidevin argues that this fails to give a satisfying account of the embodiment of Christ, and he concludes by suggesting that the best prospects for a solution lie in the kenotic model (where Christ empties himself of certain divine attributes to become incarnate).

The impetus for the furious debates on religion in recent years has not come from such arcane issues in Christian theology, but from the increasingly confident and articulate critiques of the theistic worldview offered by many contemporary atheists. Michael McGhee comments in his paper that the present climate is characterised by a certain "reactivity", each side being over-ready to disparage the opponent's position. Thus secular humanists are often charged with shallowness and a failure to cater to human "spiritual" aspirations, while some militant atheists shudder at the very word "spiritual", appearing to have a "faintly absurd antipathy" (p. 228) to anything that smacks of religion. McGhee's own project is to develop a "spirituality for the godless", which aims to appropriate traditional religious notions such as the purification of desire and the yearning for the transcendent, but without indulging the impulse of our minds to "fly to Providence and Deity" (in Francis Bacon's phrase). McGhee envisages preserving the "ethical form" of that impulse in a way that enables us to deepen our moral and aesthetic sensibilities (including universal benevolence and a sense of wonder at the glory of the natural world) by drawing on our rich heritage of traditional religious language and narrative. This is a subtle and interesting project, but it would be nice to know more about how such language can continue to work its magic once shorn of its associated theistic framework.

At the harder-nosed end of the atheistic spectrum are the papers by Peter Cave and Richard Norman, the former denouncing the "absurdities" of religion, the latter aiming to close off many philosophically fashionable escape routes for the beleaguered theist. Some of Cave's "absurdities" are described in what seems a question-begging manner: "one absurdity is simply that of believing in a 'beyond', a transcendent, a god or gods, without evidence, without good reason" (p. 126). Others are paradoxes associated with our characteristic human need for commitment coupled with our ability to step back in reflective detachment. A devout Christian may from time to time stand back from his devotions and reflect that had he been brought up in a different time or place he would have been an equally devout adherent of another religion. Or again, a morally enlightened religious adherent striving to pursue the good for its own sake may be unable to banish the thought of a heavenly reward lurking at the back of the mind. To Cave's credit, he resists the temptation to ram all this ammunition down the barrel of a Dawkinsian blunderbuss, but closes with a disarming admission that "we all live our lives . . . with some conflicting perspectives." On his final view, the difference between the theist and the humanist turns out to be not the supreme rationality of the latter, but rather the humanist's ability to rest content with this-worldly mysteries and enchantments that have no meaning beyond the flow of our contingent and temporary existence.

Norman, while deploring the oversimplified picture often drawn by Richard Dawkins of what religion is and what its adherents believe, nonetheless argues that many of his criticisms can be reformulated in a way that makes them much harder to sidestep. On the cosmological front, while conceding that not all explanations need be scientific-style explanations, Norman reasonably insists that theistic accounts still need to meet rigorous standards if they are to qualify as genuine explanations. But in reality, he suggests, many of them either leave things even more inexplicable than before, or else collapse into declarations of non-rational faith (pp. 109-110). Much of the rest of the paper is taken up with criticising various construals of religious language that resile from making literal and factual claims -- for example, interpretations that emphasize metaphorical language or the role of religious praxis and community. Some of the discussion here could have been more detailed (the importantly different notions of the metaphorical and the analogical, for example, are lumped together), but Norman's conclusion, that such approaches are "inherently unstable" (p. 123) unless some cognitive doxastic content is retained, offers a serious challenge that merits further attention.

Although Norman does not explicitly target Wittgensteinian strategies in the philosophy of religion, some of his strictures may remind the reader of the approach taken by D. Z. Phillips, whose influence is apparent in an interesting contribution by another Swansea philosopher, Mario von der Ruhr, entitled "Christianity and the Errors of our Time." Ruhr's main focus is on the work of Simone Weil, whose uncompromising exposure of the corrupt thinking she discerned in both the secularists and the religious believers of her time sheds a gloomy light on many aspects of our own contemporary culture. The lessons of Weil's Gravity and Grace (still not given the full attention it deserves in contemporary philosophy of religion) are brought home to good effect here, in particular what she has to say about idolatry -- not only the idolatry of atheism, with its "uncritical deference to science as the only paradigm of true knowledge and understanding" and its espousal of "narrowly utilitarian conceptions of the good" (p. 209), but also the idolatry of religious piety in purveying facile consolations that somehow trivialize the reality of suffering and death. As Ruhr points out at the close of his essay, quoting Benedict XVI, whatever it means to believe in divine grace, it is not to be thought of as a "sponge which wipes everything away, so that whatever someone has done on earth ends up being of equal value" (p. 225). Reading Ruhr's essay should serve as a powerful corrective to the banality of much of the current debate on religion and indicate the need, when tackling these issues, to strive for something like the purity of heart of which Weil so eloquently spoke.

A number of more specific essays complete the collection. These include Peter Millican's acute scholarly paper on Hume's treatment of miracles, Douglas Hedley's insightful and erudite reflections on the concept of sacrifice, Peter Byrne's careful discussion of the problem of religious tolerance in a pluralist society, Mary Midgley's brief but trenchant paper on Darwinism and meaning, and Clare Carlisle's luminously sensitive exploration of Kierkegaard's account of spirituality and the journey of faith. Philosophy of religion these days is a booming subject, and few among its growing number of devotees will not find something to interest them within the pages of this collection.