Philosophy and Temporality from Kant to Critical Theory

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Espen Hammer, Philosophy and Temporality from Kant to Critical Theory, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 260pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107005006.

Reviewed by William Blattner, Georgetown University


Espen Hammer's fascinating and challenging Philosophy and Temporality from Kant to Critical Theory advances three principal theses. First, a distinctive form of temporality emerges in modernity. By "temporality" Hammer means an understanding and lived experience of time, not a metaphysics of time per se, although in developing his argument Hammer must sometimes engage with metaphysical theories of time in some of the authors he considers. Second, this modern temporality embodies a form of nihilism that some of the leading figures in modern philosophy have sought to overcome through alternative conceptions of temporality. Third, the best hope for such a displacement of modern temporality lies in a version of Adorno's temporal interpretation of aesthetic experience. Hammer's development of these theses is rich and innovative, and although, as I shall explain, I am not entirely won over by his arguments, this is an important and valuable study. It is also very well written, which along with its circumscribed length makes it a rewarding read.

In Hammer's analysis modernity is defined by the rise and eventual dominance of what Weber called "purposive-rational action," that is, action whose aim is to achieve specified goals in a maximally efficient fashion. Such instrumental rationality is not, by itself, new. What is new in modernity is the decline of what Weber called "value-rationality." Value-rationality insists upon the intrinsic value of some ends -- historically, ends that are provided by one's culture, religion, or intellectual tradition. Within the ambit of intrinsic ends stipulated by value-rationality, purposive-rational action is simply the means of achieving those ends. With the advent of modernity, however, instrumental rationality takes the pre-eminent position, and traditional values are called to stand before the tribunal of efficiency. Much of this is not new to the philosophical analysis of modernity, though Hammer presents the argument in a particularly clear form.

Hammer's most important contribution lies in his argument that these features of modernity are embodied in a distinctive experience of living in time in which the traditional patterns of ritualized feasts and celebrations, as well as cyclical (seasonal) temporal patterns, are subordinated to the overarching unity of clock-time, in which empty, meaningless, and uniform units of time tick away in a linear and indefinite future-directed fashion. "How, then, is time experienced? For one thing, since what matters is the moment of satisfaction (the actualization of the end), the time which separates the agent from it must be dead or meaningless time -- a time to be overcome" (p. 51).

There are a number of ideas packed into this conceptualization of temporality. First, modern temporality is future-oriented. "What matters" is the future moment of satisfaction, which condenses into itself the entire value of the action. Second, the intervening time in which the action takes place is "dead" or "meaningless" in that it has no value of its own; its sole value is that it is required in order to achieve satisfaction. Third, since the intervening time of action is itself without value or meaning, purposive rationality demands that "speed is here the crucial factor. If the means are employed effectively, they will make possible a relatively swift execution of the action and shorten as much as possible the time until the end is achieved" (p. 51). Fourth, in order to assess the efficiency of the action, time must not only be measurable (a core feature of traditional conceptions of temporality, e.g., in Aristotle), but the measurement of time must be as precise as possible. The clock, with its almost limitless capacity to be made more precise, displaces traditional instruments of measurement, such as natural cycles and seasons. Finally, when these features of modern temporality are combined with capitalism -- especially the commodification of labor -- human labor, human action, is itself absorbed into the regime of speed, efficiency, and instrumental rationality.

Think of the way in which traditional rest days (sabbaths -- for that is what the Hebrew word "shābath" means) are overridden by the imperatives of efficiency. A modern worker cannot take for granted that he or she will be able to avoid having to work on his or her observed sabbath. The traditional distinctions among sacred and ordinary times are an obstacle to achieving efficiency. Consider the way in which resting on a sabbath, or in modern desacralized language, a "day off," is justified as promoting the efficiency of the worker, rather than simply because it is a sabbath, a day on which one is called to rest.

This "flattened out" modern temporality both embodies and reinforces a form of nihilism. Because everything is subordinated to the logic of efficiency, and the standing of traditional values is eroded by the obstacles they present to efficiency, the modern subject is increasingly thrown back upon his or her own resources in order to invent or stipulate the ends of action. As the subject is increasingly drawn into the logic of efficiency as an object -- that is, as something to be made more efficient -- the only value and only goal of the entire cultural and economic system in which we live is the very efficiency of the system itself. As Marx famously wrote, "All that is solid melts into air," and all of reality is drawn into an all-consuming network of resources whose sole goal is to generate more resources, more capital (if one views the phenomenon through a Marxist lens) or a more efficient "standing reserve" (viewed through the lens of the later Heidegger's conception of the technological understanding of being).

After setting up the concept of temporality and the notions of modernity and modern temporality in chapters 1-2, Hammer then follows a series of attempts to overcome the nihilism of modern temporality. In chapter 3 he examines Kant's and Habermas's notions of autonomy, as well as a neo-Aristotelian attempt (in Lorenzo Simpson) to return to a pre-modern form of temporality. He then leads his reader through a chapter-by-chapter examination of Hegel, Schopenhauer, Nietzsche (both early and late, in two chapters), Heidegger, and finally in a single very dense chapter, Post-Modernism (Lyotard), Marxism (Jameson), and Critical theory (Bloch, Benjamin, and Adorno). He argues that only Adorno's appropriation of Bloch and Benjamin promises any hope of a successful response to modern temporality. It would take too much space to attempt to summarize Hammer's analyses of each of these thinkers. So, what I will do in what follows is say something both about the general forms of failure Hammer identifies in most of the attempts to overcome modern temporality, and about the germ that he locates in Adorno. I will finish up by suggesting that the initial argument, that modern temporality is nihilistic, is unconvincing.

The responses to modern temporality that Hammer considers may be organized into three general classes. The first, and by far the least successful, are attempts to recover some transcendent, sacred, or primordial temporality, some form of eternity, in human life. As Hammer interprets them, the strategies of Hegel (eternity incarnate in time as the dialectical rational structure of subjectivity), Schopenhauer (eternity as the temporality of the will as it is in itself), and the early Nietzsche (primordial temporality as the ecstatic standing outside of routinized time experienced in Dionysian celebration) may be thought of this way. All of these attempts founder on a basic incapacity to make their transcendent temporality in any way commensurable with the lived realities of modern subjects.

The second class of strategies includes those of the later Nietzsche and Heidegger. Both of these thinkers, according to Hammer, propose that the subject may impose his or her own values upon experience in a way that exempts them from the logic of purposive-rational action. The later Nietzsche offers an operationalized vision of an eternal recurrence, in which the will recovers the past by declaring, "Thus I have willed!" That is, by embracing the past as if it had been willed by the individual, who creates himself or herself in an artistic act, one reconciles oneself with the past and makes time meaningful. In Heidegger's account of "profound boredom" in his 1929/30 lecture series, The Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics, Hammer locates another attempt to overcome the meaninglessness of modern temporality. In profound boredom one is bored in the face of time; one is radically disaffected from the meaningless Now of modernity. Heidegger's response, Hammer argues, is an assertion of the individual's own commitment, in which one "can suddenly, and only through auto-affection, be brought to the point of being able to make a firm decision on which to base future action" (p. 185).

Hammer argues that the solutions offered by both the later Nietzsche and Heidegger (as he understands him) founder on a common thread of voluntarism. That is, the past and present are given meaning only through the way in which they serve the future-oriented self-definition of the individual agent. Because the past embraced by a Nietzschean or Heideggerian agent does not have any intrinsic value, but rather simply insofar as it is absorbed into the agent's future-oriented self-definition, the past is not really the past. It is a projection (or better, retro-jection) of the future.

However, since for this very reason the creations of such a post-historical agent cannot carry any historical weight, the experiences they engender will be empty. There is no authority behind them with reference to which they can be justified as worthy of our attention and interest. (p. 159)

This critique mirrors the reductio ad absurdum that Merleau-Ponty (in the "Freedom" chapter of Phenomenology of Perception) runs on Sartre's account of radical freedom in Being and Nothingness. Merleau-Ponty's argument was inspired by Heidegger's analysis of temporality in Being and Time, and that in turn suggests that Hammer may have misconstrued Heidegger as a voluntarist. I will give below some reasons to believe he has.

Hammer tackles the third class of strategies in his dense final chapter. He draws on the writings of Bloch and Benjamin for a vision of aesthetic experience that can fit into Adorno's conception of how experience might resist the totalizing logic of modernity. Hammer draws on central aspects of Adorno's aesthetic theory, according to which in the experience of art authoritative contents present themselves in such a way that they normatively call to the subject, but yet resist being absorbed into the logic of efficiency and commodification. The invitations these contents present are not publicly articulable in the normal way. They take the form of hopes, rather than imperatives. By holding on to hope, as it bodies forth in art that resists commodification, the subject can encounter a glimmer of redemptive experience.

Let me end by describing an inadequacy in Hammer's development of the problem of modern temporality. Hammer sets up the discussion by way of a contrast between the flow of meaningless clock-time and a more traditional experience of sacred and/or mythological time. In sacred time there are times that befit certain inherently worthy activities or events. If history is fundamentally articulated, e.g., by covenants, the founding of temples, the enslavement and freedom of one's people, then not only is history as a whole meaningful in virtue of embodying these events, but also further and dependent forms of temporality that lend meaning to human lives through ritualized consecration and retrieval become possible. Within the life-cycle of an individual there are sacred rituals (of birth, marriage, and death, e.g.) that post a claim to a distinctive status within one's personal history in virtue of their participation in the larger narrative of humanity and the divine. The calendar, moreover, embodies cyclical re-enactments, retrievals, or renewals of our commitment to and engagement with the sacred, through the annual feasts and celebrations of one's religious community. Modernity attacks this traditional temporality by transforming time into a resource that is subject to the imperatives of efficiency and the logic of commodification. This much is convincing and powerful. But if sacred and traditional time is compromised in this way, are we left only with meaningless clock-time?

Hammer focuses his interpretation of Heidegger on his 1929/30 discussion of profound boredom, rather than the contributions to an analysis of temporality that Heidegger offers in his 1927 Being and Time. In the latter treatise Heidegger identifies and describes clock-time or Now-time phenomenologically. He also describes what he calls "world-time" (Weltzeit). World-time is the temporality of everyday human activity and engagement, a time that is variously articulated by the tasks we must undertake and the activities and engagements that we are regularly called upon to participate in. World-time is not a metric time, that is, it is not a time of measurement; the "vulgar" or "ordinary" conception of time, which in modernity becomes clock-time, plays that role. Rather, world-time consists of the articulated and normatively structured times of our daily routines, such as breakfast time, dinner time, lunch time, as well as the normatively articulated times of our everyday projects and commitments, such as reading time, play time, Stammtisch, church time, etc. Human life is unimaginable without world-time.

If life were reduced to the commodified and meaningless time of Taylorist efficiency or the time of industrial or technological processing, in which time is, as Hammer describes, something to be overcome, hence dead and meaningless, then there would be no bed time, story time, family time, no weekends, no weekly happy hours, etc. That would indeed be a nihilistic existence. Such an existence, however, is not just the logical extreme of tendencies within capitalism and modernity, but also a form of existence in which a fundamental aspect of human temporality (world-time) has been occluded. Such occlusion, however, does not result simply from the undermining of traditional or sacred time. Rather, for world-time to disappear, we would have to cease to find ourselves always already entangled in projects and commitments, in families and work and communities, for it is our entanglement in those phenomena that explains the intelligibility of world-time.

This sort of nihilism I frankly find unimaginable. The early Heidegger (though perhaps not the later) also regarded it as unintelligible. That is why world-time is an essential feature of human experience in Being and Time. For this reason I think it unlikely that Heidegger was trying in 1929-30 to overcome the extreme nihilism Hammer describes. This then calls into question Hammer's attribution to Heidegger of a form of voluntaristic auto-affection. Such a desperate strategy is only required if the nihilism Hammer describes is a genuine existential threat. But it is not.