Philosophy and the Law of Torts

Placeholder book cover

Postema, Gerald J., Philosophy and the Law of Torts, Cambridge University Press, 2001, 336pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521622824.

Reviewed by Heidi Li Feldman, Georgetown University Law Center


Stop. If you are reading this review because you might be interested in reading Philosophy and the Law of Torts, stop reading this review and start reading the book. Yes, Philosophy and the Law of Torts – a recent release in the series Cambridge Studies in Philosophy and Law – is that good. Not every essay, not every part of every essay, but enough of the essays and their parts are so good that I cannot in good faith urge you to expend precious time reading my assessment. Trust me, spend the time on the book.

There are other anthologies that in some way or another relate philosophy and tort law. But most of these are “readers” aimed at first-year law students, to acquaint them with a variety of theoretical perspectives – historical, economic, philosophical, feminist, etc. – on tort law. Most of these readers anthologize materials previously published , usually first appearing in law reviews. The editors cut the most technical or repetitive parts, and provide a perfectly serviceable collection of scholarly commentary on tort law, sort of a “greatest hits” compilation. This last characteristic, the “greatest hits” quality, enhances the usefulness of an anthology for a beginning tort student – she can become acquainted with a body of literature that her professors, some advanced students, some judges, and some policymakers know. But the “greatest hits” syndrome lessens the interest of a torts-theory anthology for that very group of readers – those already familiar with what the novice does not know.

In vibrant contrast, Philosophy and the Law of Torts offers selections from one cutting edge of legal theory and tort studies. Rather than attempt a tasting menu – a sampling of theoretical approaches – Philosophy and the Law of Torts sticks primarily to an Anglo-American philosophical vantage point, with an important contribution from Mark Geistfeld, a seriously economically oriented theorist well-acquainted with and respectful of philosophy and what it offers to the overall project of deepening our understanding of the North American common law of torts.

Perhaps the most striking feature of Philosophy and the Law of Torts is the collection’s overall emphasis on understanding tort law: not drastically reforming it, not abandoning it, not whining about it. This book is deep. Although the authors do make suggestions for and recommendations against doctrinal changes, the collection has a bent toward the kind of reflectiveness about a subject that makes good philosophy good. The essays make us see tort law and debates about tort law in new lights; they clarify issues in both doctrine and in theory; and they fertilize our minds for further developing tort practice and theory. With only the occasional exception, the authors refrain from cantankerousness in favor of constructiveness, even when they are depicting or opposing an argument or view rival to their own. In short, Philosophy and the Law of Torts is, for the very most part, a model of what a scholarly colloquium about law and philosophy should be: very little axe-grinding, much serious and original thinking, and a challenging yet refreshing book to read. Plus, even though I’ve contrasted Philosophy and the Law of Torts with the sort of collections often used in law school teaching, I intend to use the book in an advanced, upper-level law school seminar. The students will probably be daunted at first, but even if I as teacher cannot reassure them, the book itself quickly will. The authors write with sophistication yet avoid obtuseness.

Different readers of Philosophy and the Law of Torts will enjoy different essays. My personal favorites include Martin Stone’s “The Significance of Doing and Suffering”, Arthur Ripstein and Ben Zipursky’s “Corrective Justice in an Age of Mass Torts”, Mark Geistfeld’s “Economics, Moral Philosophy, and the Positive Analysis of Tort Law”, and Gregory Keating’s “A Social Contract Conception of the Law of Accidents”. I also relished editor Gerald Postema’s introduction. Rarely does reading an introduction reward a reader so greatly. Professor Postema is a pro, Professor of Law and Professor of Philosophy at The University of North Carolina at Chapel Hill. His extended discussion evidences his deep familiarity with law, with moral and political philosophy, and with much of the state of tort scholarship prior to the appearance of Philosophy and the Law of Torts. Professor Postema motivates the overall project of the book (by opposing a new philosophical analysis of tort law to the one generated by economically-minded tort theorists in the late twentieth century); organizes the pieces in the collection both in relation to one another and in relation to classic themes and issues in moral and political philosophy (e.g. liberalism, pluralism, political theory versus moral theory, competing theories of justice); and develops a description of and an argument for interpretative tort theory (theory that pays careful attention to tort practice before dismissing it as developed by the legal system). Presumably, Professor Postema selected the contributors to this volume. I commend him for giving equal weight to familiar voices, such as Jules Coleman’s, and newer ones, such as Martin Stone’s. Canadian voices such as Arthur Ripstein’s and Bruce Chapman’s are welcome too. One complaint: there are a number of women torts scholars with training and expertise in law and philosophy equal to the book’s all-male line-up. The absence of any contribution from any of these scholar reinforces an all too prevalent misconception about Anglo-American philosophy and legal theory – that these areas are somehow the exclusive province of men or that they represent a male perspective. Many men and women have this misconception, and for whatever reason, Professor Postema missed a chance to make a dent in correcting it.

To illustrate just why I had such fun reading the essays in this book, let me write briefly about a couple of them. First, “The Significance of Doing and Suffering”, by Martin Stone. Professor Stone possesses both a J.D. and a doctorate in philosophy. In this essay he very deftly draws upon a certain philosophical tradition, alerting the reader to its roots in Aristotle, and then subtly referencing modern and contemporary moral philosophers such as Ludwig Wittgenstein, John McDowell, and David Wiggins. Even full-time philosophers find these thinkers exceedingly challenging. Stone manages both to use their work and to illuminate it by explaining how a certain cultural practice – Anglo-American tort law – cannot be understood independently of a concept in some sense generated by that very practice: corrective justice. Via this explanation, Stone makes a compelling case for the centrality of corrective justice in Anglo-American tort law; excavates a deeper understanding of the idea of corrective justice; and, without fanfare, demonstrates the power of a line of philosophical thought often misunderstood or regarded as excessively abstract.

Writing from a very different perspective, Mark Geistfeld pulls off a similar hat trick. Trained both as an economist and a lawyer, Professor Geistfeld rejects conventional legal thinking about the distinction between and respective roles of positive (descriptive) and normative analysis of a field of law – torts. Old-style law and economics scholars developed this distinction and at least avowed a commitment to the former and a disinterest in the latter. Some torts theorists have thought economic analysis only serves a positive purpose, ceding normative work to moral theory. Others have insisted that economic analysis fails positivistically, but rely on it for normative recommendations. Professor Geistfeld offers up a much more interesting claim: “Positive analysis … does not provide grounds for choosing between economic and moral interpretations of tort law; it is the ground that unites them.” (p. 252) The novelty of this contention is matched by Professor Geistfeld’s skilled defense of it. Furthermore, Professor Geistfeld does a fine job of explaining the political stakes that depend on the correctness of his claim and its supporting arguments.

With the foregoing thumbnails of two of my favorite essays in Philosophy and the Law of Torts, I have attempted to convey the zest and intelligence the volume’s contributors bring to their topics. This all too rare combination surfaces in almost every contribution to the book. There is almost no plodding in Philosophy and the Law of Torts. Even if you do not go in for legal theory, try this volume – you will learn much about tort law and tort theory while getting to enjoy the virtuosity of some top-notch interdisciplinary, ground-breaking thinkers in the field.