Philosophy and The Novel

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Alan H. Goldman, Philosophy and The Novel, Oxford University Press, 2013, 209pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199674459.

Reviewed by Ole Martin Skilleås, University of Bergen


Alan H. Goldman argues and demonstrates a rich conception of literary art and interpretation, where perception, emotion, cognition and imagination together make up the appreciation of a work. The book covers eight chapters -- half of which have appeared in the Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism and Philosophy and Literature in earlier versions. The first half is called 'Philosophy of Novels' and is concerned with philosophical issues more directly, while the latter half -- called 'Philosophy in Novels' -- deals with the full interpretation of four novels and what these can say about the deep issues Goldman takes them to be concerned with.

That novels engage our emotive, perceptive, imaginative and cognitive faculties simultaneously is indicative of their aesthetic value, according to Goldman. This integrative perspective of aesthetic value was one he first set out in Aesthetic Value nearly twenty years ago, and it is much in evidence in this book as well. Goldman presents a perspective on literary art -- chiefly novels -- that integrates aesthetic and moral value. He is very much aware of the personal element in literary appreciation, and partly for this reason he does not go in for the didacticism of some contributors to the academic debates about the utility of fiction in moral and ethical deliberation. Rather, he steers a course between the Scylla of didacticism and the Charybdis of formalism that appears -- to me at least -- both sensible and helpful.

The broad outlines are set out in the introduction. That form and thematic content interact is a commonplace that Goldman has no problem explaining, but he manages to show this as well as tell it in the second part of the book. His repeated insistence on the inherent value of the interconnectedness of all aspects of reader response to literary fiction -- the full and vigorous exercise of our capacities -- is Aristotelian in its roots. While this broad spectrum appreciation is autotelic, Goldman argues for its utility as well without being lured by the temptations of didacticism. There is no sharp boundary, he claims, between the aesthetic and the utilitarian. The full appreciation is in any case the starting point, and the utility -- if any -- is derived from reflection on this in relation to other aspects of life and society. Goldman's arguments are commonsensical rather than deductive or inductive: 'Just as exercising our muscles generally improves our physical abilities, so does exercising our minds develop our mental capacities' (p. 9). Reading novels does not necessarily lead to improvements in cognitive, emotive or imaginative capacities, but they 'might provide us with imaginary templates that facilitate . . . real life reflection' (p. 9). Those of us who read a lot of fictional works are likely to want to believe in their beneficial effects, but for this reason we should be extra careful about jumping to conclusions in these matters. Goldman readily admits that while these claims are empirical in nature, the empirical evidence for any utility is hard to find.

While these arguments are more appealing than compelling, weaker still is an explanation for why we have empathy with fictional characters. This, Goldman suggests, is because the areas of the brain harboring the belief that something is fictional is isolated from that responsible for emotional responses (p. 10). I consider this a very minor lapse in an otherwise careful and sensible outline of important issues in the philosophy of literature. After all, Goldman is far from convinced about the presumed moral improvement from reading novels. An increase in emotive capacity (if that is what it is) does not necessarily lead to an increase in its utilization.

However, the formalism (as Goldman puts it) of Peter Lamarque and Stein Haugom Olsen also comes in for criticism. It is outdated and too narrow, just like the expressivism of the romantics. We can learn more from fiction, he says, than what is envisioned in their institutional theory. According to Goldman, Lamarque holds that literary works such as novels are fictional and not necessarily true of the real world. So far so good. But this also implies that anything cognitive one may derive from fiction will have to be checked against what is actually the case in the real world, so one could not actually learn anything new from fiction. At best, we may only be reminded of what we already know.

Goldman, however, maintains that we can learn something new from fiction, e.g., the consequences of acting on principles, and conceptual truths such as what moral agency entails and how it develops. This, as we shall see, is demonstrated in the second half of the book. But Goldman does not ignore the importance of rooting the fictional learning in reality, because of the role he attributes to what he calls 'foundations'. They are the knowledge we bring to the encounter with the fictional works, and this is extended by the fiction through coherence and the testimony of the authors. Coherence with what we know is important to judge the reliability of any testimony in the fiction. He does not stop there, however, since knowledge of the author's background and experience is necessary in order to assess if he or she has had sufficient experience to back up the fiction. But is it really so easy to make great claims on behalf of fictional literature -- that it is all to do with making it cohere with what we already know? And is what we do derive from literary works really valuable?

Goldman claims that in reading fiction we do -- unlike in real life -- get the whole process of thought and action leading up to the crucial decisions. In real life this process is mostly hidden, and perhaps we don't even know what is going on within ourselves. Others mostly hide what they are thinking, or at best we get some highly edited extracts from our most intimate friends. However, one may wonder about this supposed benefit given that the characters in question do not exist, and have never been alive or have ever thought a single thought. A vital ingredient if you want to believe that this gives readers real insight is that the author is a very special sort of person not only in being able to craft fictions, but also in looking into the souls of people in ways that we as readers cannot. However, if these stories and this soul-searching appear truthful to us, we may perhaps -- whether through our coherence making activity or in some other way -- be able to judge the likely truthfulness of this searching of non-existent souls.

Part of the reason for philosophers to engage with literature, and particularly novels, is that so much literary criticism from professional literary scholars is formalist in nature, or perhaps more concerned with arguing for one fashionable theory or another. Here Goldman comes to the rescue in the second part of this book. The novels chosen are not from the fringe, but rather canonical works familiar to many readers outside the hard core of literature lovers.

The common concern both in the selection of these four works and in the presentation of Goldman's interpretations is moral motivation, development and dissolution. Many literary works teach us nothing about moral issues or the development of personality, and it is to Goldman's credit that he is circumspect with regard to the claims he makes on behalf of literature and literary appreciation.

A common element in these four works is that central characters have to make crucial decisions that come as the conclusion of a long moral and social process, and in which moral character is of the essence. In all these novels, the real self (or lack thereof) of the character emerges in this crucial decision. Only, of course, these are characters and figments of an author's imagination. The extent to which we may actually learn something -- as opposed to merely believing that we have learnt something -- rests on whether the fiction is true to real characters and their development. That some authors are highly skilled in making the readers suspend disbelief, and to present credible characters, circumstances and developments does not mean that those same authors are capable of relating real insight into general truths about the human psyche or the circumstances that influence it. This may or may not be the case, but lovers of literature should perhaps be a little more wary of jumping to conclusions about the human soul based on reading made-up stories about non-existent people doing things that have never happened -- no matter how skillfully those stories may be crafted.

The four novels interpreted by Goldman are Jane Austen's Pride and Prejudice, Mark Twain's Huckleberry Finn, John Irving's The Cider House Rules and Joseph Conrad's Nostromo. As a somewhat lapsed Conradian I will, given the constraints on space, focus on the latter novel.

In the chapter on Nostromo Goldman mentions several philosophers who have written on the self and character, but in the main it is an interpretation of the work that has the disintegration of moral character as its main theme. Many readers have had trouble reading this novel because there are no characters with which to identify since the inner lives of the characters are notable only by their absence from the narrative. Much literary criticism, therefore, has taken the novel to be mainly concerned with the effects of material forces on society. Goldman's take on the main characters' inner lives and their selves is that they are moral frauds who act publicly for hidden and selfish motives that are at odds with their professed aims and ideals. They are isolated from the others, particularly from those that could and should fulfill them and confirm their identities.

Conrad's novel is one in which the reader cannot identify with any of the characters because they have no coherent self with which to identify. This early modernist novel thus thematises a modernist concern: the fragility and disintegration of the self. Goldman's challenge to philosophers is to pay more attention to extended narratives like this one, where moral progression and identity are explored in certain contexts.

However, it remains somewhat unresolved whether Goldman's readings -- which are typically summarized as '[Novel Name] shows that . . . ' -- actually show this, or whether it is Goldman who wants the novel to show something. Who is then our instructor -- Goldman or Conrad? Do interpretations of novels in Goldman's fashion work as anything more than -- or different from -- extended examples in a philosophy book? The best way to find an answer is to read Goldman's book, of course, and take it from there.

Goldman's style is easy and engaging, and reading this book is a real pleasure. None of the quibbles above should detract from the conclusion that this is a welcome addition to the literature on philosophy and literature.