Philosophy as Drama: Plato's Thinking through Dialogue

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Hallvard Fossheim, Vigdis Songe-Møller, and Knut Ågotnes (eds.), Philosophy as Drama: Plato's Thinking through Dialogue, Bloomsbury, 2019, 247pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350082496.

Reviewed by Brooks A. Sommerville, University of British Columbia


Roughly sixty years ago, certain interpreters dragged the study of Plato's dialogues into the modern world by subjecting them to analytic philosophical methods. So goes the prevailing history of Plato scholarship. With this development, specialists could explain their research to their colleagues using familiar modern categories, and -- what is perhaps just another way of saying the same thing -- it conferred modern respectability on a set of texts whose place in philosophical research had come into question. Unfortunately for the study of Plato, the story does not end there. This newfound respectability came at a cost, for it did not fall equally on every Stephanus page. While scholars readily saw how they could apply modern techniques to the crisp, logic-chopping exchanges between Socrates and his interlocutors, this new focus crowded out other, more dramatic elements, chief among them the very status of these texts as dialogues.

The book seeks to reverse this trend and establish the centrality of the dialogue form to our understanding of Plato's philosophical project. This collection of thirteen essays is the culmination of a seven-year collaboration of scholars at American and European Universities, a research project entitled, Poetry and Philosophy: Poetical and Argumentative Elements in Plato's Philosophy. The book's editors are Hallvard Fossheim, Vigdis Songe-Møller, and Knut Ågotnes of the University of Bergen in Norway; Fossheim and Ågotnes are also contributors. While many of this volume's individual chapters make important contributions to the study of Plato's dialogues, its animating assumptions are under-defined and under-defended.

In the volume's introduction, the editors outline its guiding ethos, with chapters then divided thematically into four parts. By and large, the individual chapters steer clear of its editorial polemic against the present scholarly neglect of the dialogue form. Presumably they are meant to stand mainly as exemplars of its distinctive approach, and indeed many of the chapters are works of exemplary scholarship, calling attention to neglected dramatic elements in Plato's dialogues. Before turning to some of these chapters, however, it is worth airing a couple of worries about the editors' introductory formulation of their approach.

First, there is the worry that the editors simply overstate the dominance of the analytic approach. Their introduction acknowledges a pedigree of fellow travelers almost as old as the supposed analytic revolution noted above, undermining the book's claim to be overturning some entrenched orthodoxy. That practitioners of the maligned analytic approach go unnamed only heightens this worry about a straw man.

Second, and perhaps more importantly, at times the introduction seems to go awry in its characterization of the issue. Consider the following statement of the book's approach: "This alternative approach takes as a starting point the assumption that other dimensions of the text than their argumentative structure and the formulation of their theses are philosophically relevant" (p. 1). A singular focus on the dialogue form seems too narrow to cover everything contained in these 'other dimensions.' For example, the introduction goes on to list Plato's use of myth among the dramatic elements that often resist a tidy analysis into premises and conclusions, but Plato's editorial decision to use myth to advance certain philosophical goals is presumably quite distinct from his decision to write in dialogue form. We are left with the impression that everything in Plato that is neither a premise or a conclusion is being herded into the 'dialogue' column -- or else 'dialogue' is meant to function as an odd sort of synecdoche for Plato's entire literary register. It would go some way toward clearing up this confusion if the editors were to set up their own approach consistently as one stressing the philosophical significance of a broad set of dramatic elements in Plato's dialogues, rather than having 'dialogue' stand in for the whole set.

At the same time, the introduction's statement of the issue may grant too much to the other side, in that it seems to ratify the practice of carving up Plato's dialogues into their 'argumentative' and 'extra-argumentative' dimensions. For philosophical and polemic reasons alike, it may be preferable to resist more determinedly the very assumption that it is helpful to divide a Platonic dialogue along these lines in the first place -- as though reading Plato were an exercise in extracting genuine philosophical content from some larger, non-philosophical mass, like sifting for gems. Partisans of a more holistic reading of Plato ought to lay claim to the most 'analytic' elements of Plato's dialogues along with his myths, images, and speeches, in my view. Perhaps a more promising formulation appears a little later in the introduction, when the editors declare that "argumentation in the strict sense does not exhaust the philosophical meaning of a dialogue" (p. 1). But this brings us back to the first worry: how many 'analytic' readers of Plato would deny this much? This is not to say that the scholarly trends to which the editors are responding are not real, or not worth challenging, but that greater precision and consistency are necessary, about both the nature of the enemy and their number, before making any declaration of war.

The volume's first part, 'Genre and the Philosophical Dialogue,' comprises four chapters focusing on the dialogical elements in Plato'sSymposium, Apology, Crito, and Republic. Following chapters by Drew A. Hyland, Elena Irrera, and Hayden W. Ausland, Part 1's final chapter, 'Plato's Ring of Gyges and Das LebenderAnderen' by Jacob Howland, compares the myth of Gyges in Book II of the Republic to Florian Henckel von Donnersmarck's acclaimed 2006 film about the horrors of life in the police state of 1980s East Germany. On Howland's interpretation, the film's character of Gerd Wiesler, a dedicated member of the Stasi charged with surveilling the home of a celebrated writer and his stage-actress girlfriend, is a mirror image of Gyges in Plato's famous myth. On Glaucon's telling, Gyges' discovery of a ring that magically confers the power to become invisible sets him out at once on a rampage of espionage, murder, sexual assault, and regicide. Granted similar powers of omniscience and impunity, Wiesler succumbs only to the sublime temptation to risk his own career (if not his life) to spare a man he has never met -- a man who conspires against the regime that granted Wiesler his awesome powers in the first place.

Hyland thus frames von Donnersmarck's film as an extended counterexample to Glaucon's myth, a case for beauty's efficacy in waking the soul and stirring the conscience even in a totalitarian hellscape. Of course, Hyland's interpretations of both works are open to doubt, particularly his reading of Plato's Gygean myth. For example, in pressing the parallel with Wiesler, Hyland may overstate the epistemic elements of Gygean power. While it is true that Gyges' first use of the ring is to eavesdrop on a conversation, this appears only to be in service of Gyges' more appetitive and spirited aims of domination, profit, and sexual gratification. Wiesler genuinely wants to know his subject; Gyges just wants to rule the world. Having said this, Hyland's account of what he takes to be Gygean elements of the Republic's subsequent account of political life within the Kallipolis is both provocative and insightful.

Part 2 turns to the themes of 'Virtue and Soul-shaping.' The first chapter is Paul Woodruff's 'Plato's Inverted Theatre: Displacing the Wisdom of the Poets.' Focusing on the Phaedrus' central myth, Woodruff diagnoses Plato's hostility to poetic wisdom as essentially religious in nature. On the traditional poetic view, (a) we ought to consult the gods before making big decisions; and (b) our laws ought to enjoy divine sanction. As Woodruff points out, the philosopher-kings of Plato's Kallipolis ignore both strictures. Plato's precise objection is subtle on Woodruff's reading, in that he agrees with the poets that the gods are to guide us in practical life. Where the poets go wrong is in supposing that our relationship to the gods is to be characterized by awe. Plato takes the gods to be moral exemplars, beings we seek to emulate -- a way of seeing oneself on the same moral plane that is simply at odds with poetic supplication.

Woodruff then turns to some implications of this theological revolt against the poets for the Platonic account of the virtues. He finds three poetic moral virtues on Plato's chopping block: reverence, good judgement, and compassion. As Woodruff acknowledges, Plato at times hews to convention in recognizing reverence as a genuine moral virtue: it is one of the five Socrates takes to be in some sense 'one' in the Protagoras, and it takes centre stage in the Euthyphro. But Woodruff reminds us that reverence is conspicuously absent from the Republic's list of virtues. He speculates that the Euthyphro may furnish an explanation for this absence: Socrates' proposal late in that dialogue to demote reverence to a sub-department of the genuine moral virtue of justice may represent something like Plato's sincere view. Plato is at it again, closing the moral chasm separating mortals from immortals to the point that justice essentially covers it all. His objection to good judgement is more epistemic, on Woodruff's reading. The thought is that a person who exercises good judgment necessarily does so in the absence of genuine knowledge. Since the gods are not only moral but also epistemic exemplars, they do not make decisions without knowledge and hence they have no need for good judgement; to the extent that we emulate the gods, neither do we. (Those familiar with Woodruff's work on sound deliberation will find a dramatically condensed recapitulation of that account here.) The traditional virtue of compassion meets a similar fate, as it is grounded in our sense of shared human frailty, something the gods obviously have nothing to do with. Woodruff neatly sums up Plato's dispute with the poets as a 'perfectionist' campaign against what he takes to be a perverse poetic celebration of human imperfection. Part 2's two remaining chapters by Jens Kristian Larsen and volume co-editor Ågotnes focus on virtue and soul-shaping in the Sophist and the Symposium,respectively.

The book's third part, entitled 'Reason and Irrationality,' comprises three chapters. In the second of these chapters, 'Pleasure, Perception and Images in Plato,' Cynthia Freeland outlines what she takes to be two genuinely Platonic accounts of pleasure. On the first account, which Freeland calls the 'replenishment view,' pleasure is the restoration of the body to a healthy condition. It applies most straightforwardly to the bodily pleasures. For example, on the restoration view the pleasure of eating consists in the restoration of the stomach from an unhealthy condition (emptiness) to a healthy one (fullness). On the second, 'psychological' account, pleasure is a form of awareness and thus has intentionality. Freeland takes the psychological view to represent a more philosophically satisfying account of pleasure. Her primary concern in the chapter is not to make the case for the psychological view's superiority, however. Instead, Freeland identifies four dialogues in which versions of one of these views are in evidence. While the character Callicles in Plato's Gorgias gives the replenishment view its most memorable expression, Freeland instead focuses on its formulation in the Phaedo. Next in line is the Theaetetus, where, according to Freeland, Plato takes a crucial step toward the psychological account when he includes pleasures and pains with perceptions in the dialogue's evaluation of the thesis that knowledge is perception. Freeland locates another important shift in the Timaeus, which improves on the Theaetetus' thesis that pleasures and pains are simply perceptions by introducing the more sophisticated view that they 'arise from' perceptions. Finally, she finds a clear articulation of the psychological view in Plato's Philebus, where Socrates famously draws out something like a corollary of the psychological view: namely, that pleasures, like beliefs and judgments, may be false.

Freeland's analyses of these competing accounts of pleasure are both careful and compelling, and her decision to explore some less obvious dialogues in connection with questions of pleasure is felicitous. At times she is perhaps too cautious in resisting certain interpretive commitments, however. For example, Freeland stops short of making any definitive claims about development, though the evidence she adduces is strongly suggestive of a developmentalist picture, on which Plato migrates from the replenishment view to one she acknowledges to be more philosophically satisfying. Moreover, her characterization of true pleasures as representations of states of affairs that are "truthful and genuinely good" ducks an important interpretive controversy about how precisely we are to construe the Socratic view that false pleasures 'misfire' in some sense. Part 3 also features a more general chapter by Kristin Sampson about music in Plato, and a fascinating reading of the Phaedo by volume co-editor Fossheim.

The collection's fourth and final part is entitled, 'Place and Displacement.' In the first of its three chapters, Erlend Breidal examines these themes in the Phaedrus, with the last two chapters by Gro Rørstadbotten and John Sallis exploring them in the Sophist. Sallis' 'Plato's Sophist: A Different Look' calls attention to the dramatic setting of the dialogue, stressing that it represents a conversation occurring on the day after the Theaetetus' discussion. Sallis reminds us that the Theaetetus closes with Socrates mentioning that he is off to be arraigned for Meletus' indictment later that day. Hence, Socrates' legal defense against the charge of sophistry motivates the Sophist's project of delimiting the philosopher and the sophist. This, along with the addition of the Eleatic Stranger to yesterday's cast of characters, sets us up for a conversation that is meant to be a continuation of the one dramatized in the Theaetetus, albeit with some key differences.

Sallis concludes that the Sophist's distinction between the sophist and the other type in need of demarcation in the dialogue, the statesman, includes three moments in which the philosopher makes an appearance. The only one of these appearances amounting to more than a 'glimpse' of the philosopher occurs, on Sallis' reading, in the dialogue's core ontological discourse. With its attention to the dialogue's dramatic setting and other key dramatic elements, this chapter develops a reading that is no doubt emblematic of the approach championed in the book's introduction.

There is much to recommend in this volume. While the case for its interpretive assumptions leaves something to be desired, its individual chapters are by and large original and perspicacious. Plato's Symposium and Sophist receive the most attention in this collection, so readers in search of close readings of these dialogues in particular will find much of value.