Philosophy Between Faith and Theology: Addresses to Catholic Intellectuals

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Adriaan Theodoor Peperzak, Philosophy Between Faith and Theology: Addresses to Catholic Intellectuals, University of Notre Dame Press, 2005, 232pp, $22.00 (pbk), ISBN 0268038872.

Reviewed by Michael D. Barber, S.J., St. Louis University


Professor Adriaan Peperzak's Philosophy between Faith and Theology seeks to integrate the intellectual life, in which the author has distinguished himself in continental philosophy and Levinas scholarship, with the life of faith, the descriptions of which testify to the authenticity of his own faith. Though the contents of the book originated as separate lectures, the text fits together as a whole, with the first half discussing the personal and institutional dimensions of a Catholic philosophy and the second half extending this philosophy to concrete investigations into such topics as faith, onto-theology, and philosophical/theological wonder.

The book abounds in perceptive analyses of such topics as prayer (13, 63), faith (as loving trust) (19), the hidden self-will at times concealed in the ascetical life (152, 154), the humility of God in God's love of humanity (20, 138), and the importance of the struggle for justice as intrinsic to faith (41, 96, 153, 165). In addition, Perperzak conveys his usual fine insights into Levinas's thought, particularly regarding how access to the ethical summons of the other relies upon the involved first-person perspective of the one facing the other (97, 100).

In developing the Catholic philosophical position in the first half of the book, Perperzak wrestles with a set of issues clustered about modernity and the autonomy of reason. After running through some common-sense modernist and religious-oriented genealogies that he admits are "simplistic" (6-8), his critique focuses on how modernity separated mysticism from science (10, 26) and gave birth to the idea of a supra-historical thinker beyond worldly, historical existence (72). Admitting that this differentiation of faith and science was accompanied (and influenced) by the growth of democratic pluralism (25), Peperzak characterizes modernity as empirically, scientifically and positivistically inclined (7, 8, 67, 83, 109, 132); aimed at progress and certitude (11); and focused on a version of calculative, technological, formal, and instrumental rationality that "could prostitute herself to any conviction" (10-11, see also 23). Once detached from faith, rationality was able to represent itself as the rival of religion and philosophy as the true religion (76-77). This modern version of rationality, exaggerating the practice of theoría in Greece (106), conceived thought as autonomous and severed it from every connection with the wealth of non-scientific experience, even though the myth of an unprejudiced, autonomous, and independent point of departure, believed in by most modernists, has never been realized (65).

Part of Peperzak's positive response to modernity's deficits is to insist upon the recognition of the pre-predicative and pre-propositional, affective strata of lived experience in which desire is particularly prominent and out of which reflection and thematization emerges (49, 75, 130-131). In addition, the author urges that the Western tradition reflect more thoroughly upon the understanding of personality and interpersonal activities. These suggestions for improvement seem appropriate, but the author seems to overlook the many voices within the modernist tradition that have already objected to modernity's pathologies. For instance, David Hume and the moral-sense and Lebensphilosophie traditions were attuned to the role of affectivity. Immanuel Kant and the Kantian tradition, including recently Jürgen Habermas, have protested mightily against the instrumentalization of rationality and its "prostitution to any conviction" and have sought to constrain growing scientism by situating scientific rationality within a more encompassing picture of rationality that attends to the moral and aesthetic dimensions of human life. One can point to other figures, who never considered themselves outside the modern tradition and who sought to correct modernity's neglect of worldly, historical existence and to restore the importance of affective-desiderative and even religious dimensions. Here one thinks of phenomenologists such as the later Husserl, the early Heidegger, Scheler, and Ricouer, or pragmatists like James. Considering modernity's own self-corrective tendencies, one wonders whether Peperzak, despite his dismissal of simplistic common-sense genealogies, may have portrayed modern rationality a bit too monolithically, stressing its scientism and positivism, and, consequently, proclaiming somewhat prematurely its demise (xi).

The author, however, does not uncritically polarize modernity and Christianity since he acknowledges, on the one hand, that modernity's struggle for human rights and against discrimination "deserves unreserved devotion" (41, see 153), and, on the other, that Christianity has shown itself unnecessarily hostile to science and to the struggle for human rights and economic well-being (24, 39, 44-45, 60). In the end, he recognizes that both modernity and Christianity have produced their share of violence and yet that grace is omnipresent in each (60). Therefore, he calls for mutual learning between modernity and Christian faith and between believers and modern/postmodern opponents of religion (52, 141).

In the first essay of the second part of the book, Peperzak expands his earlier assertion that a pre-predicative affective layer of lived experience is needed, and he develops a meta-philosophy (73). According to this meta-philosophy, "religion," broadly understood and functioning like Paul Tillich's ultimate concern, refers to the fundamental dimension of human life in which questions of ultimate meaning are asked and answered, such that even agnostics and atheists believe that existence has meaning (74-75) -- albeit a nontheistic one. The problem with the modern self-conception of philosophy as autonomous is that it believes it can claim independence with regard to the lived existence from which it springs instead of recognizing "the faith-based essence of philosophy" called for by Peperzak's meta-philosophy (73). In such a meta-philosophy, philosophy is "relatively autonomous," playing a self-aware, self-critical role in concrete human life and striving to think for all human beings universally, while bracketing without repressing its own existential character and thus still remaining at the service of a particular "faith" (74). Peperzak's meta-philosophy depicts modern philosophy as a kind of "religion," pursuing its own rooted engagement with existence and serving as the thinking element within its own "religion," alongside other religions and no longer able to claim ultimacy, universality, and authority over them (80). Such a move restores to modern philosophy its existential seriousness while robbing it of its meta-philosophical monopoly since it no longer stands as the highest court or tribunal before which other religions must legitimize themselves (82).

This meta-philosophy locates philosophy on a map with reference to the lived engagement with reality from which it emerges, and this map improves upon a meta-philosophy whose exaggerated notion of philosophical autonomy might deny its own existential roots. Nevertheless, it is from a third-person perspective, outside philosophy and outside its existential base, that one plots them on this map. However, if one imaginatively places oneself within the philosophical viewpoint, adopting it from a first-person perspective, including the viewpoint from which Peperzak has articulated his meta-philosophy, one would discover a conception of philosophical autonomy that, though relativized, is robust and needs to be robust. In the first place, like modernity's meta-philosophy, Peperzak's too is a meta-philosophy, authoring ultimate, universal, authoritative claims about how philosophy must function. It too functions as a higher tribunal legitimizing philosophical viewpoints and de-legitimizing others, though in a much more inclusive manner than the philosophical high court of modernity did. The claims contained within this meta-philosophy are addressed to those of any faith (including atheistic, agnostic faith) with the expectation that interlocutors need not share one's particular faith to assent to them. Insofar as one believes that one's arguments will stand on their own before an interlocutor, who, it is hoped, will consider his or her full experience in considering them, this meta-philosophy appears to be independent of the lived existence from which it may have sprung. Of course, one's particular faith might "motivate" the development of this meta-philosophy, but the arguments for the meta-philosophy, though begun in private faith, take on an autonomous life of their own, insofar as the normative constraints of philosophy itself demand that one ought to abandon arguments that are not convincing even if they would support one's faith or embrace convincing ones even if they seem to lead in a direction opposed to one's faith. Autonomy seems inherent in the philosophical attitude itself. Moreover, one might use one's pertinence to a private faith as an example of the rooted engagement with existence for which one argues, but one's faith then serves as an occasion for an insight into the structural features of rooted engagement that, it can be argued, all kinds of faiths share, rather than serving as a dogmatic first-premise with which those of different faiths must comply. Within the reflective, philosophical attitude undertaken from within a first-person perspective, one's private faith recedes to a degree into anonymity, and autonomy characterizes the philosophical consideration of the reasons for a meta-philosophy. Perhaps all this simply amplifies on what Peperzak means by describing philosophy as a universalizing that brackets without repressing its religious underpinnings.

But how might these underpinnings, one's rooted existence, affect the process of philosophical reasoning leading to the meta-philosophical position? Apart from the previously mentioned deployment of one's experience of private faith as an example leading to autonomous insight into rooted engagement -- and the modernist meta-philosophy that Peperzak criticizes might have ruled out a consultation of such experience -- one's rooted existence might also function causally. In this case, however, while one focuses on developing reasons for the meta-philosophy, one's background experience of private faith might be inclining one to find reasons convincing beneath the level of the conscious focus on the arguments, behind one's back, as it were. However, the discussion of whether the reasons given are true and why proceeds on a different plane than psychological explanations of why one finds arguments appealing, as Husserl's critique of psychologism in Logical Investigations showed. Otherwise, Peperzak's own meta-philosophy would simply be a psychological expression of his Catholicism, and nonbelievers and non-Catholics need not take seriously its claim to be true. In fact, often in looking back after one has developed what one takes to be true reasons one speculates about the underlying psychological factors that might have influenced one's recognition of their truth. Thus if one develops reasons for a meta-philosophy that seems to make room for one's private faith, one might hypothesize that one's commitment to that private faith was "influencing" all along the development of these arguments for the meta-philosophy. But in these cases, one detects the influences of rooted existence on philosophizing from a third-person perspective, outside the first-person viewpoint of the one engaged in giving reasons for the meta-philosophy that one would never claim to be true simply because they accord with one's private faith. In summary, one's private faith might serve as an initial motivator in arguing for a meta-philosophy like Peperzak's, as an example leading to insight into rooted engagement, or as a psychological source disposing one to accept the arguments for a more inclusive meta-philosophy. Nevertheless, in none of these ways is the philosophical autonomy responsible for determining whether the arguments for the meta-philosophy are true undermined. Philosophy's autonomy in developing and criticizing reasons is ultimately a matter of philosophical responsibility not to assent to arguments simply because they proceed from one's enrootedness (or because they deny that enrootedness either) but because they are true. Perhaps, though, this explanation of how rooted existence influences "philosophizing" merely clarifies how philosophy's autonomy is "relative" to the conditions of its emergence, as Peperzak claims.

It is important, though, to preserve a strong role for philosophical autonomy with reference to one's private faith and rooted existence. It is certainly quite possible that an unprejudiced philosophy, reflectively poised over and against that enrootedness, might find it instructive and endorse the values emerging from it, though the modernist meta-philosophy Peperzak opposes might not have allowed for this. At the same time, philosophy has the capacity to criticize the private faiths of rooted existence, so that, for instance, it can reject the misogynist, anti-scientific, or non-ecumenical biases that Peperzak himself thinks ought to be abolished from religious faith. Philosophy ought not to be the ideological pawn of one's existential enrootedness, even though its criticisms can be a matter of loving service of it; in fact, it does not serve if it is a mere ideological pawn. Again, these comments perhaps fill in some details of what Peperzak means when recommending that philosophy play a self-aware, self-critical role in concrete human life.

Another interesting discussion in the second half of Peperzak's book has to do with his arguments for onto-theology, which include metaphysical discussions of God and proofs for God's existence (35), which have been much maligned in postmodernist thought, and which many believe yield a God who is "too pale, too cold and boring, too abstract and unreligious" for those touched by Biblical faith (181). However, avoiding the extremes of fideism and the rational deducibility of God (36) and unwilling to abandon 2600 years of metaphysics (86-87), Peperzak contends that onto-theology need not be an obstacle to approaching God (89). Instead it can be integrated with prayer and spirituality (91), and it can reveal for us our own transcendence toward God (66, 191) and enable us to explore the transcendent attributes of a God before whom we can not only dance but also worship. Figures like Augustine and Anselm anticipate Peperzak's view of onto-theology insofar as their speculations about God frequently appeared within prayer addressed to God (169). One aspect of Levinas's thought relevant to this discussion of onto-theology, mentioned (100) but not fully exploited, has to do with the appearance of the third person who moves us beyond the dyad of the face to face onto the plane of reason and philosophy for the sake of all others. The giving of a philosophical account of one's own beliefs, so central for Plato, is for Levinas a matter also of ethical responsibility to another and to all others. In onto-theology, believers reach out intellectually to their others, just as the believer's development of a meta-philosophy aims at addressing others in their own, philosophical, general terms. In the light of Levinas's third person, even the philosophical autonomy discussed above in connection with meta-philosophy need not be taken for egoistic self-enclosure, as it is often is, but rather it constitutes a moment within an overarching project undertaken in ethical responsibility on behalf of others and to them.

Although this review has focused on the intellectual dimensions of the relation between faith and intellectual life, Peperzak makes several astute observations on how the trusting, loving attitudes of faith would inform the spirit, the attitudes, and virtues (e.g., respect for others, "a good ear" for them, benevolence, generosity, humility) of the believer's scholarship or participation in intellectual dialogue (25, 27 69). Peperzak illustrates how even believers involved in such a formal, abstract discipline as mathematics can bring faith to bear, inquiring about the meaning of their work for human lives and communicating with others (26-27). Perhaps one of the great questions Peperzak raises (17, 31-34) is why believing philosophers are often unwilling to explore the linkages between their faith and intellectual life -- an unwillingness that this book eloquently invites one to move beyond.