Philosophy Between the Lines: The Lost History of Esoteric Writing

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Arthur M. Melzer, Philosophy Between the Lines: The Lost History of Esoteric Writing, University of Chicago Press, 2014, 453pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226175096.

Reviewed by Bernard Yack, Brandeis University


Those of us who were introduced to the history of moral and political philosophy by students of Leo Strauss -- in my case, Allan Bloom -- would sometimes ask for evidence backing their claim that the great writers of the past practiced a lost art of esoteric writing. The answers we received, I'm sorry to say, were never very satisfying: a scrap of Bacon here, a letter from Diderot there, a passage or two from Plato's Seventh Letter. Surely, so vast a conspiracy must have left a larger mark on Western literary culture? Where were the books and articles that connected all the dots? Without such confirmation, it was hard to dispel the suspicion that it was Strauss's charismatic authority, more than anything else, that confirmed the existence of this esoteric tradition for our teachers.

Here Arthur Melzer finally delivers the kind of work we asked for back then, a book that collects and categorizes the evidence for Western philosophers' use of esotericism. He uncovers no smoking gun, no hidden philosophers' listserv devoted to the dissemination and protection of the secret writer's arts. But he does amass an enormous amount of testimony, testimony from major figures in every age from Classical Antiquity through the Renaissance and Enlightenment, confirming knowledge and approval of these ways of esoteric means of communicating philosophic ideas. Esoteric writing, this testimony makes clear, was no secret. It was a familiar and unremarkable feature of the Western philosopher's intellectual landscape right up to the beginning of the 19th century.

Melzer's book performs an additional service by distinguishing the variety of goals pursued by esoteric writers. He thereby helps clear up some of the confusion created by Strauss's decision to title his account of the subject, Persecution and the Art of Writing, a decision that has led many to wonder why esoteric writing would be needed in places where one could speak one's mind openly. Melzer shows that while self-defense is the commonest reason for adopting esoteric modes of communication, it is far from the only one. Some philosophers choose to communicate esoterically to protect delicate social practices and institutions from what they perceive as dangerous truths, rather than to protect themselves from persecution. Others do so for pedagogical reasons, from a desire to write in a way that forces abler readers to work out truths for themselves, as Plato seems to do in his dialogues. And others write esoterically in the pursuit of radical change, out of concern about their society's readiness to accept fully spelled out programs of reform, a justification for the practice that appears repeatedly among Enlightenment reformers and some of the revolutionaries that they inspired. Melzer devotes a chapter to each of these uses of philosophic esotericism, providing copious evidence of philosophers' familiarity with these different reasons for choosing to communicate between the lines.

I believe, therefore, that we now have an answer to the question of whether there was a tradition of esoteric writing among pre-19th century Western philosophers. Case closed. Melzer may exaggerate the degree to which this tradition was lost from view -- given 20th century experiences with persecution, how could we completely lose touch with the arts of self-protective writing, such as the use of what Russians describe as "Aesopian" language? But he does not exaggerate the breadth or the depth of Western philosophers' familiarity with esoteric approaches to writing. The evidence presented here should convince all but the most dogmatic and anti-intellectual skeptics that Western philosophers knew about and regularly made use of esoteric means in communicating their ideas.

Yet I suspect that Melzer's book will not, in the end, convince most of these skeptics. For while the book does an excellent job collecting the evidence for the existence of philosophic esotericism, it does not do nearly as good a job explaining what these philosophers are doing when they communicate between the lines. In particular, it fails to distinguish between two different kinds of esoteric communication: the extremely common practice of distancing oneself from the explicit meaning of a specific argument or authoritative citation, and the far rarer practice of working out arguments as a continuous undercurrent and corrective of the explicit claims made in a text. Most skeptics, I suspect, might be ready to acknowledge that Machiavelli and Montaigne, Plato and Aristotle, even Montesquieu and Rousseau, do not tell you everything that they want you to take from their writing, that they sometimes plant reasons in their texts to look beyond the more explicit meaning of their words. But few are likely to swallow the notion that all these authors, let alone playwrights like Shakespeare and Sophocles, produce works that continuously subvert their most prominent arguments in ways that help readers construct an alternative, esoteric argument to take their place. And with good reason. For this kind of esotericism is extremely rare. In fact, I do not think that Melzer provides us with a single good example of such an argument. Nevertheless, he leaves us with the impression that the lost continent of esoteric writing he has discovered is teeming with them. And his "Beginner's Guide to Esotericism" (Chapter 9) shows young explorers how to track the traces that they leave in their texts. In other words, Melzer uses the massive evidence of a relatively limited kind of esoteric writing to convince us of the value of searching for a different, very rarely encountered form.

When Montaigne, for example, complains about geographers who think that they can redraw the map of the world just because they have visited Palestine (in his famous essay "Of Cannibals"), I think we are justified in reading something more into his remark than dissatisfaction with contemporary atlases. On the one hand, its surface meaning takes aim at one of the commonest forms of intellectual arrogance: our exaggeration of the significance of the things that we just happen to have discovered ourselves. On the other hand, the example Montaigne chooses encourages his more free-spirited readers to think about the way in which we exaggerate the significance of one especially celebrated form of knowledge: literal and metaphorical familiarity with the Holy Land and all of its wonders. But does this example of esoteric communication, and countless others like it in Montaigne's Essays, point us to a counter-current of argument that subverts and replaces the main line of explicit arguments found there, arguments about our radical inconsistency, our natural propensities to cruelty, and the dangers of political and religious innovation? I see no reason to think so. In assessing these arguments it is very important for us to know that the person making them -- especially the arguments against innovation -- is no thoughtless adherent of political and religious orthodoxy. So Montaigne's esoteric digs and projections have a role to play in our reception of the explicit arguments that he makes in the text. But they do not point us to means of correcting and replacing them.

Let me illustrate the difference between these two ways of communicating esoterically with a non-literary example: the symphonies of Dmitri Shostakovich. That Shostakovich sewed his later music with signs of his resistance to his Soviet persecutors is generally recognized, though the degree to which he did so is highly controversial. His Fifth Symphony, the work that he wrote to save his career -- perhaps his life -- after being subject to severe criticism for the "formalism" of his earlier music, is a searing, dramatic work that builds to a powerful conclusion, a conclusion that, according to the socialist realist canons he was being pressed to follow, had to be triumphal and life-affirming. So Shostakovich brings the work to a close with a pile of D Major chords from the orchestra punctuated by tonic-dominant thumps from the tympani. (Most Western conductors rush through this coda at double speed, as if embarrassed by its banality.) One can never be certain, of course, but it sounds like Shostakovich is signaling to the more discerning members of his audience not to take the coda seriously, that this is Stalin's notion of music, not his. Such a gesture is genuinely esoteric, since it satisfies orthodox opinion in a way that communicates to another audience one's distance from orthodoxy. But nothing about that communication changes the way in which we understand the music that precedes the coda. Those forty minutes of tense, comic, and elegiac music communicate directly to us, rather than through the prism of Shostakovich's esoteric gesture at the end of the symphony.

Shostakovich's Tenth Symphony, by contrast, communicates in a way that compels us to rethink the surface impressions of the whole piece. For in this symphony Shostakovich introduces a four-note signature motif -- constructed from the initial letters of his first and last names (D-S=Eflat-C-H=B) -- as a kind of musical character. That character steps on stage in the third movement, driven along by a weak and stuttering fanfare, like a hero approaching on a lame donkey. It goes through a number of adventures until it is caught up in the requisite celebration of socialist life in the Finale. But while the closing music is joyous, one cannot help but notice that the hero, represented by the signature motif, is being torn wildly this way and that by its exuberance. In the end, the tympanist beats out Shostakovich's name again and again over the last frenzied rush of notes, as though he were being passed from hand to hand over the heads of a wild and noisy crowd. Here Shostakovich's decision to communicate at multiple levels compels us to rethink the whole work, not just register his distance from something expressed within it.

The vast majority of expressions of philosophic esotericism, I would suggest, resemble Shostakovich's Fifth Symphony more than his Tenth. That includes the two paradigmatic cases that Melzer introduces in Chapter Two to acquaint the reader with esoteric writing. The first of these focuses on Machiavelli's use of the Old Testament story of David and Goliath. David, the Bible teaches, slew Goliath with a slingshot, trusting in God's hand to guide him. But in Machiavelli's version of the story, David comes armed with a knife as well, thereby suggesting that even God endorses Machiavelli's insistence that we should trust only in our own arms. I have no doubt that Machiavelli is playfully invoking and subverting Biblical authority in these passages. But he does so to support, not subvert, his explicit argument: the danger of relying on the forces controlled by others to reach your goals. Nothing in these passages directs us to a parallel line of argument designed to correct and replace the message delivered on the text's surface.

Melzer's second example focuses on Plato's Republic and the way in which it subverts our lofty expectations about justice. The problem with this claim is that there is nothing esoteric in the way that Plato goes about subverting these expectations. Plato's just city is explicitly presented as a kind of cave founded on a lie told by its philosopher-king. And the deflating conclusion that justice, in the end, amounts to "a pattern laid up in heaven" to guide individuals in the ordering of their own souls, rather than in the construction of cities, is a quote from the dialogue, rather than a subversive counter to its explicit teaching. That conclusion may not be what we expected to hear when Socrates took up Glaucon's challenge to prove that the just life is good for its own sake, rather than as a means of avoiding some evil. But we reach this unexpected conclusion by following the explicit lines of argument from Book 2 to Book 9 of the Republic, not by reading between the lines. That's not to say that Plato is uncomfortable with esoteric gestures. When Socrates says at the end of the Crito that there is no point in arguing with him about the account of political obligation that he gives there, since he cannot hear anything over the voice of the city's laws, which buzz in his head like the flute's music in the ear of the mystic, it is reasonable to infer that Plato is distancing himself from this conclusion in some way. But one reason to draw this inference is the inconsistency of the Crito's conclusion with the explicit arguments about law and justice in works like the Republic.

To suggest that the continuous subversion and correction of one's explicit philosophic arguments is a relatively rare practice is not to deny its existence. The most likely place to find it is in the works of Maimonides and other Islamic and Jewish rationalists of the medieval period. They were, after all, heirs to an exegetic tradition that more or less attributed that kind of writing to the Divine author of holy scripture. Since God cannot, by definition, make mistakes, any inconsistencies or misrepresentations that we find in scripture must therefore serve a purpose, such as concealing some deeper truths from weaker minds. Faced with the problem of how to write about such truths, especially when those truths challenged conventional orthodoxies, it seems likely that many Jewish and Islamic philosophers began to make their most important and sensitive arguments between the lines, both to protect themselves from persecution and to protect the public from potentially dangerous truths.

But once we go beyond the Mediaeval Jewish and Islamic rationalists it becomes much harder to find persuasive examples of esotericism as a practice of continuous self-subversion and counterargument. Strauss and some of his students devoted a lot of energy to interpreting Machiavelli in this way, but with mixed and highly controversial results. Others have tried to read Aristotle or Locke as consciously subverting the arguments in which they seem to defer to common sense and conventional opinion. But these efforts typically end up merely insisting that Aristotle really agrees with Plato or that Locke thinks like "the justly decried" Hobbes, conclusions that would not be especially interesting, even if they were true. (In such cases, ironically, the exoteric arguments turn out to be far more interesting than the esoteric ones that supplant them.) So while there is no reason to rule out the idea that some philosopher or other writes in this way, there is good reason to retain our skepticism about such claims. Melzer's overwhelming evidence for the existence of esoteric writing does nothing to suggest that continuous self-subversion and correction of surface arguments was a common esoteric practice.

Let me conclude by considering the discomfort that the acknowledgment of esoteric writing seems to create for so many scholars. Melzer devotes quite a bit of space to this subject, but I think he misses one of its most important sources. Esoteric communication is bound to be off-putting to the members of communities that are established and sustained by expectations of mutual sincerity. And contemporary intellectuals and academics live their lives in two such communities: the democratic political community and the scholarly republic of letters. The former tolerates all kinds of rhetorical pandering and manipulation, but it is always on the lookout for people who invoke the common interest in ways that are really designed to serve the shared interests of special interests within the community. Esoteric communication, even in the service of the public interest, is therefore bound to discomfort democrats, since it involves communicating behind the back of the people whose interests we are supposed to share.

But it is as members of a scholarly republic of letters, I would suggest, that esoteric communication makes us especially uncomfortable. For it is within that community, rather than the political community, that we do most of our communicating. When peer-reviewed articles or academic press books signal to a select target audience the falseness of claims that they explicitly present as their own -- say, by describing Leo Strauss as someone who was really not all that interested in politics (108-09) -- they counter our expectations of mutual sincerity in ways that make it difficult for us to engage with each other. (This characterization of Strauss as a relatively a-political figure, someone concerned with protecting philosophy from politics rather than using philosophy to guide politics, is a perfect example of defensive esotericism. While it may seem plausible to those unfamiliar with Strauss's ideas, the more informed know perfectly well that it is a misrepresentation, that while Strauss certainly sought to protect philosophy from politics, he was especially concerned about protecting philosophy from democratic politics and therefore promoted the idea that the natural allegiance of philosophers lies with aristocrats and other notables, rather than the people.) For the scholarly community, unlike the audience for pre-19th century philosophy, has no room for a division between insiders and outsiders, between those who reason about the world and those who receive such reasoning. We are all presumed to be reasoners -- or researchers -- in that community, and expect to be heard and addressed as such. The violation of that expectation makes esotericism seem like a threat to a form of sociability that most of us take for granted, which helps explain why so many scholars would have us sweep the subject under the rug.

That said, it would be a serious mistake to allow concern for the problems that esoteric writing might create for our own communities to serve as an excuse for ignoring the prominence of such forms of communication in the works that we study. To do so would close us off to a direct, interactive engagement with great writers of the past, as well as the expanded visions of the world that they offer us. No doubt, we need to keep a close watch over ourselves lest such engagement encourages us to read our own thoughts into their minds or to set off on perversely ingenious quests after the texts behind the text. But there is too much to be gained from this kind of engagement to let a healthy skepticism smother our longing to squeeze every drop of insight from our intellectual heritage.