Philosophy Comes to Dinner: Arguments About the Ethics of Eating

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Andrew Chignell, Terence Cuneo, and Matthew C. Halteman (eds.), Philosophy Comes to Dinner: Arguments About the Ethics of Eating, Routledge, 2016, 299pp., $33.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415806831.

Reviewed by Tina Rulli, University of California, Davis


Did you know that organic produce has a larger environmental footprint than conventionally-grown produce (175)? Have you considered that purchasing factory-farmed meat may be morally better than purchasing from a small farm, given that your individual action makes no difference in the former case but may cause some harm in the latter (185)? Perhaps everyone, including vegans, would do better eating mussels rather than strawberries (174). These are some of the surprising conversational tidbits from the philosophy dinner table set by Andrew Chignell, Terence Cuneo, and Matthew C. Halteman. Their guests, invited to discuss the ethics of eating, include an impressive range of philosophers, some familiar, some up-and-coming. Together, the ensemble coordinates a comprehensive survey of the most recent thinking about our defunct food systems and our individual complicity in them.

The anthology is divided into two parts: Part I: Dietary Ideals and Part II: Puzzling Questions. The rough schema works, though the dialogue in the essays frequently migrates across this division. I will trace several of the conversational themes.

Omnivore vs. Vegetarian: Can one coherently promote animal husbandry practices that eliminate animal suffering, all the while supporting the killing and eating of animals? Or do the arguments that would support this "conscientious omnivorism" require vegetarianism instead? Cuneo poses this question and tentatively carves a space for the conscientious omnivore by suggesting that respect for animals' basic welfare rights does not require that we refrain from killing them, so long as we treat them non-instrumentally and do not degrade them (33). Similarly, Benjamin J. Bruxvoort Lipscomb paints a detailed portrait of family farm agrarianism, in which killing animals is an essential practice. He asserts that care for animals does not entail a prohibition on their consumption (as care for plants does not prohibit their consumption). Like Cuneo, what matters is that their lives are not degraded. To degrade an animal life is "to make its life a poor one for the kind of creature it is. It is to deny it a life involving the characteristic activities and satisfactions of its kind, or to cancel these by one's use of it" (64). Lipscomb does not explain why killing an animal does not count as canceling the activities and satisfactions of the animal. He adds that killing of beings is wrong only if those beings can narrate their own lives, as humans do (67). I had expected Lipscomb would instead argue that managing the lives and deaths of livestock is an essential part of healthy land management, and so whatever disvalue there is in their deaths is outweighed by the greater agrarian goal. He dismisses this argument in favor of his own (68).

Both Cuneo and Lipscomb share the view that we must respect animal welfare, but doing so does not prohibit our killing them. Tristram McPherson questions this position, arguing for modest ethical veganism, the view that it is typically, though not always, wrong to eat mammals and birds, and use their products. It is typically wrong to kill these animals because it deprives them of a valuable future (79). This view is echoed by Dan Hooley and Nathan Nobis in their succinct and clear argument for veganism. The argument against killing animals is independent from the argument against inflicting suffering on them. But McPherson sees a tension in the conscientious omnivore's view nonetheless. It may be incoherent to hold that inflicting suffering is wrong, but killing is not.

McPherson illustrates the problem with a thought experiment: compare (a) an art installation in which suffering is inflicted on a cow for aesthetic reasons to (b) the infliction of a painful surgery on a cow to save its life. The former is clearly wrong, the latter morally permissible: "For preserving the life of the cow -- and hence its valuable future -- is enough in the second case to ethically justify inflicting otherwise wrongful suffering" (79). McPherson's suggested analysis is that the value of the cow's life is strong enough to outweigh the suffering of the painful surgery. But the conscientious omnivore, he says, is implausibly committed to the view that the disvalue of the suffering is stronger than the value of the cow's life, and thus it would be wrong to perform the life-saving surgery.

McPherson's example is clever, and I think with careful work it can be preserved. But as it stands, the conscientious omnivore may find a way to slip through its grips. Plausibly, normative reasons have two distinct kinds of strength.[1] It may be that facts of animal suffering have strong requiring strength -- we are required to avoid infliction of suffering on animals. But facts of animal survival do not have requiring strength -- we are not required to avoid their killing or to sustain their lives. Facts of animal survival may, however, have strong justifying strength. Though we are not required to save animal lives, we are justified in many instances in doing so, even if we would otherwise be required to do something else (e.g. not inflict pain on them). A lengthier treatment than I can offer here could explore whether this picture is ultimately plausible. But contra McPherson's claim, it is coherent. The success of his example depends on it surviving reanalysis with close attention to the difference between the requiring and justifying strengths of moral reasons.

Dietary Ideals: A second common theme is that of living up to moral dietary ideals. Christina Van Dyke's insightful essay poses a feminist critique of the vegan ideal. Van Dyke argues that veganism may reinforce for women the oppressive expectation to constantly monitor their dietary consumption. She advocates instead dietary choices that meet an Aristotelian mean between the extremes of doing injustice to others and doing injustice to oneself that is sensitive to individuals' situations. She rejects a solitary, privileged dietary ideal. Elizabeth Harman addresses the accommodation of others' non-ideal food choices. Moral vegetarians believe it is wrong to eat meat, yet they frequently accommodate the meat-eating practices of friends and family. Harman proposes that they do so because many vegetarians see it as a morally permissible mistake -- an act that one should not engage in, but one that it is not wrong to do. Her way of explaining accommodation, then, is to deny that many vegetarians in fact believe it is wrong to eat meat. This left me wondering if Harman thinks that most moral vegetarians are mistaken about their own mental states. If so, then she answers one puzzle by raising another.

On the empirically-informed side is Mark Budolfson's compelling and surprising essay. If we are concerned broadly about the harm footprint of our diets, including the harms to nonhuman animals, humans, and the environment, then we must look at the complex empirical results of our food choices. Veganism may not be the dietary ideal once all the information is in. A meal starring factory-farmed chicken may have a lower harm footprint than a vegan meal of quinoa, avocado, and berries (170). Rather than becoming vegans, we should be "altruistic omnivores," those who pay attention to the particular harms of products consumed. The vegan might respond that Budolfson's argument isn't an objection to veganism per se, but to unrestricted veganism. Vegans must be more altruistic. But Budolfson forcefully reminds us that animal welfare is not all that matters in choosing an ethical diet.

While most of the chapters focus on what we should eat, two assess how we go about doing it. Tyler Doggett and Andy Egan map the ways in which we make non-ideal food choices, arguing that some are defensible strategies of agents doing the best they can, given their dispositions and motivations. Non-ideal food choices may be the result of under-believing -- believing one should X, when arguments that support doing X actually support doing X-plus (113). (Think of Cuneo's argument for conscientious omnivorism and whether it in fact requires vegetarianism). Or non-ideal choices may result from under-commitment, committing to do less than what you believe you ought to do. For instance, Hope believes she ought not to eat meat, but makes an exception for the holidays (115). Doggett and Egan reveal complexity in the ways in which we can do less than what is ideal. Importantly, understanding how it is that we fail could ultimately help us in devising strategies that allow us to do better in the long run.

Matthew Halteman and Megan Halteman Zwart suggest philosophy as therapy for those struggling with accepting or acting on food ethics arguments. They offer two broad diagnoses: 1) a malaise of imagination -- struggling to accept an argument because one cannot imagine her identity as a non-meat eater, and 2) a malaise of will -- failure to act on one's beliefs for various reasons, including weakness of will. They propose philosophy as therapy. Gadamerian hermeneutics reminds us that all of our knowledge is gained through prejudice; self-awareness of our biases provides perspective when we feel the tug of defensiveness in the acquisition of new information. Hellenistic philosophy as training for living, wherein we exercise intellectual practices of reading, listening, and investigation, can help habituate and prepare us to anticipate the difficult choices we will make. This essay uniquely addresses the experience of struggling to accept difficult ethical arguments. It takes a compassionate stance toward the newly initiated and would be an excellent companion piece in an introductory ethics class, assigned right after first shattering students' comfortable world views with McPherson's or Hooley and Nobis's pro-vegan essays.

Inefficacy Objection: Even if industrial farming practices are morally wrong, is it morally wrong to purchase animal products from them? The third theme is captured by the inefficacy objection: individual consumer actions do not make a difference to animal suffering given the size and complexities of the food system, therefore we are not required to abstain from purchasing and consuming animals and their products. Authors in the anthology provide responses that can be divided into at least two broad types: symbolic and causal.

Cuneo argues that the wrong of purchasing factory-farmed meat is a symbolic one; to reject consumption of such products is to stand for the good (25). Adrienne Martin, who helpfully disentangles accomplice cases from collectivity cases, argues that we are still complicit in wrongful action even if we do not make a causal difference. The bad of being an accomplice to collective wrongdoing is in adopting a role as a member of a group that functions to signal demand for a wrongful practice. But symbolic arguments struggle to account for the intuitive wrong of purchasing or consuming wrongful products in the case where the agent fails to express or signal to others at all (example: one who smuggles some chicken from the buffet under her salad). Some may find these accounts cannot comprehensively explain the wrong of meat consumption in a wide range of cases.

Then there are the causal accounts of complicity. Harman argues that there is moral reason not to be a joint cause in bringing about a bad outcome.McPherson claims that it is wrongful to benefit from the wrongful actions of others. Ted A. Warfield raises a major objection to causal accounts. Normal transactions, such as when you pay your telephone bill, often make you a part of a causal chain wherein you pay someone who pays someone who pays someone to kill a chicken (156). Are we complicit with wrongdoing anytime we cooperate with, benefit from, or jointly cause others to do wrong? McPherson anticipates this objection by carefully narrowing his principle for wrongdoing to prohibit benefiting from the wrongful element of others' actions. We may buy the canned beans from the local grocer who sells meat, though we may not buy the meat. I worry that his efforts to fend off Warfield-style objections may undermine his argument for veganism. If the wrong in purchasing dairy, for instance, is in its causal, but contingent relation to the veal industry, and not in anything intrinsic to consumption of dairy, then it may be permissible to purchase factory-farmed dairy, as long as I don't buy the veal. In short, the causal accounts face both the inefficacy objection and struggle to find the sweet spot between permitting and prohibiting too much.

The majority of chapters focus primarily on what we as individuals are required to do. Less attention is placed on how we should modify our social systems to make ethical food choices easier on individuals (Budolfson is the exception, 174). For example, Van Dyke voices the concern that vegan diets are costlier for women due to their specific dietary needs (46). But she doesn't discuss the possibility for social remedies -- e.g. the supplementation of nutrients in available foods and increased public awareness of how to meet nutritional needs. We already do this for the nutritionally defunct Standard American Diet (SAD). The demands of eating ethically could be much abated by institutional changes that incentivize us, nudge us, and inform us in making the best decision.

Further, with the focus on individual action, a promising response to the inefficacy objection is mostly under-discussed. The inefficacy objection is better met by considering our obligations as collective rather than as individual. It may not be the case that I as an individual make any difference; but we as a collective do make a difference.[2] If I am required to do anything at all, it is to act together with others to make a difference. But what would it mean for me to raise awareness of the atrocities of factory-farming in my teaching, to write letters to my Congressional representatives to improve animal welfare, and to organize vegan meet-ups, but to make no changes whatsoever to my own individual dietary choices? There is an obvious tension here. Perhaps the collective obligation can give rise to an individual obligation. Chignell recognizes the collective obligation approach. If there is a collective obligation to abstain from factory-farmed products that others in the collective are disregarding, I have a duty to disassociate myself from their actions by strictly refraining from purchasing those products. But why is this? Chignell, who is only sketching the argument, does not elaborate.

One possibility is that failure to align one's individual action with the collective goal undermines the collective goal. Imagine after a long day of picketing at the state capitol to promote farm animal welfare, you grab a well-earned lunch at the nearby diner. There you sit in your "Animals Are Our Friends" T-shirt, chowing on a cheeseburger, when a passerby inquires about your seeming inconsistency. You confidently explain that the true change will come from collective reform, not from individual actions. True though this may be, you are relying upon your average audience to have a highly sophisticated view of moral and empirical complexities of the situation. Failing that, they may simply draw the wrong conclusion: collective change isn't so important after all since you aren't thoroughly committed in your own actions.

But I think the most promising response is an argument from integrity. By integrity, I mean having unified as an integral, harmonious whole one's actions, values, projects, and visions.[3] The aims of your individual actions should cohere with and should demonstrate hope for the broader institutional and collective goals you support. Without this, we have a portrait of a fragmented, scattered agent -- someone whose actions in the present do not reflect her aspirations. The integrity approach is not a symbolic approach; it is not about what you express in your actions. It is not a causal approach; it is not about what results your actions produce. Rather, the integrity approach is about internal coherence, about linking your actions with your will and agency. Integrity doesn't require perfection in your actions. You may sometimes fail. But it requires a consonance among your values, aims, and aspirations. Obviously much more would need to be said to defend this approach. But I think it offers a promising account of what goes wrong with the animal activist eating a cheeseburger, one that goes beyond the symbolic and causal approaches represented in the anthology.

I've collated the major themes of the anthology above. Several chapters are not as closely linked thematically to the others in the anthology. Anne Barnhill provides a partial defense of locavores against their critics. David M. Kaplan surveys moral arguments for and against artificial ingredients. Jeff McMahan writes on the harms of predatory species and provides a sustained moral argument for their elimination. His is the only essay about the ethics of what nonhuman species eat. It is a fascinating logical extension of the view that we ought to eliminate animal suffering in our own food practices.

By and large, the essays are of high quality and either succinctly present familiar arguments for a dietary position -- such as would be suitable for teaching undergraduates -- or advance new and surprising positions. The book as a whole is accessible to non-philosophical audiences and would be a fertile resource for people inside or outside philosophy looking to get up to speed on the current state of the food ethics debate. I enthusiastically recommend you pull up a chair to the philosophy dinner table and enjoy the conversation.

[1] Joshua Gert, "Normative Strength and the Balance of Reasons," The Philosophical Review, Vol. 116, No. 4, 2007, pp. 533-562.

[2] Derek Parfit. "Chapter 3: Five Mistakes in Moral Mathematics," Reasons and Persons, Oxford University Press, 1984, pp. 67-86.

[3] Bernard Williams. Moral Luck: Philosophical Papers 1973-1980, Cambridge University Press, 1981.