Philosophy from a Skeptical Perspective

Placeholder book cover

Joseph Agassi and Abraham Meidan, Philosophy from a Skeptical Perspective, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 163pp., $22.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521726399.

Reviewed by Charles Landesman, Hunter College/Graduate School of the City University of New York


After two chapters devoted to explaining what they mean by the skepticism of the title, the authors make some effort in the next four chapters to apply their skepticism to science, ethics, politics, and aesthetics. A lot of ground is covered in this brief and poorly written book, but there is very little new to show for it. The philosophy of Karl Popper provides the overall framework for their theses and arguments, but there is no systematic discussion of this framework so someone unfamiliar with Popper's work would tend to be mystified.

To the extent to which they go beyond Popper, the authors introduce in the later four chapters various psychological hypotheses such as "People are normally ready to consider (as best they can) which rules they might legislate if they were rulers of the world aiming at maximization of the welfare of humanity as a whole." (92) This appears in the chapter on ethics. Instead of attempting to justify the rule that people ought to aim at maximizing the welfare of humanity as a whole, they believe that it is simpler and more manageable to discuss the corresponding psychological generalization about what people are ready to consider. Not much effort is expended to supporting the hypothesis except for alluding to the "hope" that it is "open to empirical investigations." (92)

The main thing to clear up is what the authors have in mind by skepticism. It includes the idea of fallibilism that they ascribe to both Peirce and Popper according to which "no theory is error-free." (xiii) Since they tend to use "theory" to comprehend statements in general, then, according to this formulation, fallibilism itself is not error free, an implication that the authors are probably not unwilling to affirm, although any reader interested in knowing what the error is will have to look elsewhere. A different, more guarded formulation of fallibilism ascribed to Popper alone (which, according to the authors, "is a new version of skepticism" (34)) is "the view according to which any scientific theory may turn out to be false no matter how well it fits our experience to date." (31) A lot depends on how we take the "may". If it means merely that the statements formulating the experiences they fit do not entail the theory, it is not at all clear why this well known logical point deserves to be called skepticism.

We get closer to the meaning of "skepticism" when the authors claim that no statement is certain or plausible or demonstrable or justified or corroborated or indubitable. (ix, 2) This is supplemented by related claims such as "No position is demonstrable" (ix), "Our ignorance is unavoidable" (x), "Humans are always prone to make mistakes" (11), "All statements are doubtful" (39) Just as it would appear that we are in pretty poor epistemic shape, being unable to get beyond the evil demon, we find a somewhat weaker version: "There is simply no way to guarantee that any discourse can be certain or plausible in the epistemological sense of these concepts." The lack of a guarantee means, I think, to allude to the apparent lack of success from the time of ancient Pyrrhonism to the present day in finding a general criterion of truth that itself could be proven to be true by a line of argument that is neither circular nor generative of an infinite regress. One would think that consulting Descartes might be of interest here. However, the authors think so little of Descartes as to say that the "evil spirit hypothesis" and "the solipsist hypothesis" as well as the related brain in a vat hypothesis are "utterly crazy" and therefore need not be taken seriously unless one is insane. (25-26)

The reason for this rather cavalier dismissal of Descartes' efforts to overturn skepticism by establishing a workable criterion of truth lies in the little phrase "in the epistemological sense of these concepts" that appears here and there in this book. When the authors claim that, for example, no statement is certain, or plausible, or justified, etc., they qualify their use of these terms of epistemic evaluation by saying that they mean them "in the epistemological sense of these terms". (ix) In their use of this qualifying phrase, the authors are claiming that these terms live a double life; they have both a philosophical use and a common sense use. There are, after all, "received standards of plausibility" (32) that govern our ordinary claims to have justified a theory or any statement for that matter.

Therefore, when I claim that my watch is on my desk because I have seen it there, my claim is plausible, perhaps even justified, in accordance with received standards, although, because "our senses often deceive" (15), my claim is not plausible or even justified in the epistemological senses of these terms. The epistemological meanings of such terms reflect the quest for certainty embedded in much of the philosophical tradition, a quest that is refuted by, for example, the unreliability of sense perception (46) or "the idea that Hume proved: there is no valid inference from past events alone to any conclusion about any future events." (48) (At least something has been proved. But was it proved in the epistemological sense of the term?)

There is hardly any attempt to show that the terms of epistemic evaluation under discussion actually do live a double life. The closest that our authors come to seeing that there is an issue here is when they say of received procedures of arriving at theories employing prevailing standards of plausibility that they "do not guarantee the certainty or plausibility that philosophers usually seek: there is no guarantee that these received procedures lead to results that are invariably true, and they often are found to be erroneous." (32) In other words, philosophers who are seduced by the quest for certainty seek a level of certainty by means of procedures of verification that never go wrong, that are never erroneous, and for that reason, they use terms of evaluation in special epistemic senses that argument shows are true of nothing. For example, in the epistemic senses of the terms, no statement is justified or even plausible.

However, it is implausible to suppose that Plato or Descartes or Hume or Kant believed that their use of such terms differed from the ordinary use in such a sharp way. For if they believed that, they would have realized that their epistemological inquiries did not actually apply to any actually existing subject matter, that they were really making up the subject matter as they went along, as if they were searching not for certainty but for 'smertainty', and not for justification, but for 'jostification'. But then one would wonder why such intelligent thinkers would have thought that their philosophical ruminations would have any interest for anyone wondering how knowledge is possible. Skepticism is of interest only to the extent that it shows that the beliefs we thought were certain or justified or known to be true are not certain or justified or known to be true. There is, I think, no good reason at all to adopt the double life theory of the history of epistemology as an account of what engaged philosophers were actually up to.

The authors attempt to forestall misinterpretations of what their skepticism amounts to by denying that it implies either relativism or nihilism. Relativism claims that there is no absolute truth, and nihilism claims that all ideas are of equal value. (ix) Both are false. There are statements that are true absolutely, and some theories are better than others. One wonders how they can tell. The answer is not far to seek. After all, they are not objecting to the use of common sense methods of justification or the received standards of plausibility. So everything goes on as it has been going on despite all this talk about skepticism. They are in favor of criticism of received ideas and traditions; they endorse rational discussion and the use of experience and argument to challenge popular ideas and to improve accepted theories. Their skepticism comes down to the thought that as we make use of the standards that we have always made use of, we should keep at the back of our minds the thought that we are fallible beings and, no matter how sure we are that the theories we have fixed upon are true or rationally justified, the evidence we appeal to seldom or never entails that they are true. Well, I can go along with that.

I do not want to sound pedantic, but I would like to protest the absence of footnoted references to the works of most of the philosophers discussed. The authors provide footnoted references to some of their own works and a few others besides. There appears to be no system at all as to what does and does not get documented. Some of their interpretive and critical remarks about major thinkers such as Wittgenstein, Quine, Descartes, and Freud, and about various topics such as empiricism, and logicism, and substance, seem so wide of the mark as to require the evidence of actual books and pages to support them. Since Popper seems to be the star of the show, it would be nice to have the titles and pages of his works mentioned. After having been called to order on this matter by editors of my own work, I am shocked that Cambridge University Press has allowed this book to be published without insisting upon adequate documentation.