Philosophy in a Meaningless Life: A System of Nihilism, Consciousness and Reality

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James Tartaglia, Philosophy in a Meaningless Life: A System of Nihilism, Consciousness and Reality, Bloomsbury, 2016, 218pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781474247702.

Reviewed by Guy Bennett-Hunter, University of Edinburgh


There are many philosophical arguments for the conclusion that life has meaning. Therefore, to argue for nihilism (the claim that, not only life but the whole of reality is meaningless (ix)) is to claim that every argument for meaning in life contains some error. This ambitious undertaking is apparently central to James Tartaglia's book: as he bluntly puts it, 'nihilism is just a fact.' (19). I have in print endorsed one of the arguments for life's meaning which Tartaglia explicitly opposes.[1] But, while I disagree with this apparently central claim, I am sympathetic to another view for which this book makes an intriguing case: that 'tending the space of transcendence' is one of philosophy's central tasks (183).

A helpful introduction and opening chapter summarise Tartaglia's views, setting out his argument for the truth of nihilism. Tartaglia argues that, to conclude that life has meaning, we would have to produce not only a causal explanation of how humans came to exist, but an explanation that also warrants the attribution of a purpose to human life -- a teleological explanation of what we are here for. The requisite explanation would, in these two senses (causal and teleological), 'tell us why we exist' and thus explain the meaning of life (2). Since he believes that there is no such convincing explanation, Tartaglia's conclusion is that life is meaningless. However, he reassures us that our inability to make sense of reality, and therefore life, as a whole does not prevent us from making sense of things within that reality: we can explain and make sense of things within a certain limited context. But the groundlessness of this context entails 'that our reasons are ultimately groundless: they are reasons given within an existence that is itself lacking in reason'; in short, 'things make sense so long as we do not push too far' (43).

In an appendix to his introduction (12-19), Tartaglia summarily disposes of some of the existing arguments to the contrary, except the one with which I agree: that put forward by David E. Cooper (18-9).[2] He promises to dispatch this argument fully in Chapter 2 (18) and states that it is characterised by 'subtle differences' from his own position, which, he says, are 'to be evaluated when my position is on the table' (19). However, Cooper's work is not mentioned again.

Chapter 2 provides a survey of 'misguided' strategies for coping with nihilism, including the idea of a transcendent context of meaning (which may be intended as an implicit reference to Cooper), humanism, and relativism. While not a comprehensive survey, this chapter clearly articulates what Tartaglia thinks is wrong with many of the existing attempts to argue that life has meaning. He compares life to a game of chess and the idea that life has meaning to the possibility of achieving checkmate, which may motivate a person's moves in the game. However, the nihilist believes that 'checkmate is an illusion' (43). So we are counselled instead to refocus our attention on the moves themselves, which we may previously have thought of as merely intermediate goals. Having discovered that they are, in fact, 'the only real goals', we must value them 'for their own sake' (43). Against the charge that nihilism would encourage us to take life less seriously, Tartaglia asserts that 'there is nothing outside of life for us to take more seriously' than that meaningless life itself (44).

Chapter 3 defends the role of philosophical questioning (about the meaning of life and about how we ought to live) in opening up 'the space of transcendence'. Given the foregoing argument for nihilism, Tartaglia reassures the reader that nihilism is compatible with the idea of transcendence: it 'simply holds that there is no transcendent context of meaning.' (77). Chapter 4 persuasively defends transcendence on the basis that 'consciousness seems to transcend the world of objective thought', raising 'the prospect that reality transcends the physical universe' (85). Chapter 5, 'the key to this book' (11), sets out 'the transcendent hypothesis' in further detail, again with specific reference to consciousness. It suggests that the phenomenon of consciousness 'must be identified with something within a wider context of existence than the world it presents'; this gives us reason to accept the hypothesis 'that the objective, physical world is transcended' (104). Here, Tartaglia's suggestion resembles those of existential phenomenologists like the early Heidegger, Karl Jaspers, and Maurice Merleau-Ponty, who conclude that human consciousness (even when we concede that it is inescapably embodied), cannot be understood as a purely objective, physical object or process within the world, since it is that by which there is a meaningful world of objects for us at all.[3]

In Chapters 6 and 7, Tartaglia applies the transcendent hypothesis to make philosophical sense of time and universals, respectively -- both of which, he believes, turn out to provide additional philosophical routes to transcendence. While time is part of the objective world, 'the temporal perspective of "now" transcends the objective world' and 'the moving present conception is the result of illegitimately superimposing the transcendent "now" upon the objective order' (144). Similarly, 'we have a perspective on the objective world which presupposes universals, but universals cannot belong to the objective world', so we may conclude that universals 'are misrepresentations of transcendent being' (161). The volume concludes with a summary reminding the reader once again that the transcendent hypothesis is not incompatible with nihilism, because 'there is no reason a transcendent context should be a context of meaning; that would be an extra claim' (170).

Tartaglia's argument for nihilism turns on the idea that a successful explanation of life's meaning would have to be both causal and teleological. But why do we need to know anything about human origins or believe that human life exists for some purpose in order to suppose that life has meaning? As Leszek Kołakowski points out, it is not even necessary for meaning-conferring explanations to be true, as in the case with genealogical myths or myths of human origins, which combine 'truth' and 'poetry' in varying proportions, perhaps to the degree where the myth is wholly 'false' in purely factual terms. But the question of factual truth seems irrelevant to the function of such mythological explanations, which is not merely to provide 'interesting information about a community's genealogy' but also to provide a 'principle of legitimacy' that gives 'meaning to the community's continuing existence -- a meaning defined and situated, so to speak, at the source of being'.[4] There is no reason to think that mythological explanations of the origins of humanity as a whole function any differently. If it is unnecessary for mythological explanations to be literally true in order to confer meaning on life, why should we insist that all explanations of life's meaning be causal and teleological in nature?

As I mentioned at the outset, a successful argument for nihilism would imply that all arguments for meaning in life are erroneous. I have already observed that Tartaglia fails explicitly to refute Cooper's argument for this conclusion but, in my view, he fails to do so implicitly as well. Cooper argues that nihilism would undermine what Tartaglia calls the 'social meaning' (15) of our practices and, in the end, would be unendurable, because 'An activity whose point is to contribute to something that itself turns out to be pointless retrospectively inherits this pointlessness.'[5] We could not actually bear to continue living our lives if experience really were structured in this way. The fact that most of us do bear it suggests that it is not usually so structured. The unavailability of checkmate would undermine the meaning of the moves in the game of chess, which have no inherent meaning for which they might be valued 'for their own sake'. Their meaning just consists in their contribution to the possibility of checkmate. Therefore, given that the game continues, there is a logical as well as a psychological need to suppose that life has meaning and nihilism is false. Tartaglia's implicit response to this line of reasoning is that we simply refrain from pushing too far with our questioning regarding meaning. In order to live a normal life, the most that we need is the presupposition 'that our goals are worthwhile while we are engaged with them' (47). 'Nihilism tells us that life has no overall goal, but we can still act as if it did' (172). 'Of course we do not need to take up the theoretical question of what -- if anything -- makes our goals worthwhile in order to presuppose them; we do this effortlessly as soon as we stop thinking about it' (47).

It is most odd to encounter a sentence in a philosophy book that amounts to an encouragement to stop thinking. But this is the essence of Tartaglia's implicit response to Cooper. We would need an additional claim to the transcendent hypothesis in order to conclude that life has meaning: we would also need the claim that the transcendent context is a transcendent context of meaning. While Cooper thinks that we need this additional claim because, manifestly, life is (on the whole) bearable and would be unendurable without it, Tartaglia thinks that life is endurable, even without this claim -- as long as we stop thinking about it. In my view, this is no refutation of Cooper's argument. And it is surely incumbent upon philosophers, of all people, to push a given line of questioning as far as it will go, even if the potential consequences may be judged unwelcome or disturbing. While Tartaglia is right to claim that 'you do not need transcendent meaning if nihilism is morally neutral and simply a fact', it takes only one sound argument for life's meaning to falsify nihilism. Tartaglia has not shown this particular argument to be unsound.

However, it may not matter that the truth of nihilism is still in question, because not only is nihilism 'boring' (7), it is also dispensable to 'the key to this book' (11): Tartaglia's project of establishing the transcendent hypothesis. This hypothesis is at best compatible with nihilism. It neither entails it nor follows from it. Tartaglia concedes that 'the existence of transcendent reality has no effect on the truth of nihilism' (145) and that 'if reality is transcendent, then nihilism may not be true' (179). In light of these concessions, the first half of Tartaglia's book looks dispensable, if not irrelevant, to the second.

Regarding the second half, in which Tartaglia defends the transcendent hypothesis: this is where I find myself in most agreement. However, this defence would have benefitted from reference to Karl Jaspers, whose philosophical project is extremely close to Tartaglia's at this point. Both aim to account for the meaning of scientific inquiry and human existence in the light of transcendence, all three of which are modes of Jaspers's 'Encompassing'. Tartaglia's claim that experience is not part of the objective world described by science, and his view that 'experience and the objective world are both parts of an interpretation of transcendent reality' (122, 176), are consonant with Jaspers's tripartite system. Jaspers, who consistently opposed dogmatic religious and superstitious misinterpretations of transcendence in favour of 'philosophical faith', would agree that 'Once transcendence is disentangled from religious meaning, its philosophical potential is released.' (171).[6] Tartaglia shares Jaspers's philosophical aim of steering a course between denying transcendence entirely and appearing to affirm it, but to filling the space with objective (religious or superstitious) realities (180). He shares Jaspers's vision of philosophy's task of 'tending the space of transcendence' (183), which, for Jaspers, is passed like a torch from one philosophical generation to the next, sometimes only as a 'glimmering spark', until the next, greater thinker can rekindle it to a brighter flame.[7] Tartaglia would have found much in Jaspers that would have helped to shape this key to his book.

The unstated affinities between Tartaglia's aims and those of Jaspers indicate, to this reader, that the concept of ineffability would have been a more fitting companion to the transcendent hypothesis than nihilism. The very argument that Tartaglia fails to refute concludes that there is a context of meaning but that this is, as he correctly states, 'an ineffable mystery which provides the measure of human existence -- something "beyond" the human but still intimate with it' (18-19). If Cooper at times resists the language of 'transcendence', this is in order discourage the incoherent misinterpretation of his 'ineffable mystery' as a Kantian noumenal realm, a cosmos, or a god that 'transcends' the human world in an analogous way to the extra-terrestrial beings that Tartaglia imagines ( 49).[8] Such a conception would render the resultant explanation of life's meaning circular, because it would explain life in terms of some of the very concepts and meanings with which that life is itself invested, or (in the case of Tartaglia's aliens) in terms of what is 'just as much a part of the physical universe as we are' (49). Given the falsity of nihilism, an explanation for life's meaning that avoids this circularity is required. Such an explanation is provided by Cooper's appeal to the concept of ineffability, which confers meaning on life precisely by referring to a determinately contentless context of meaning, beyond (though intimate with) life itself. Compatible (like nihilism) with the transcendent hypothesis, the appeal to ineffability explains the meaning of life in terms of a transcendent context of meaning -- but not a causal or teleological one, which would render the explanation circular. It would have provided everything that Tartaglia requires of nihilism without the dispensable and untenable conclusion that life, and therefore the practices and projects that contribute to it, is meaningless.

This reader found the unorthodox practice of referring to endnotes using superscript and subscript anchors, depending on the notes' contents, an occasional distraction from the fluidity of the text itself. On the whole, Tartaglia's book is an intriguing contribution to the ongoing philosophical discussion regarding the meaning (or meaninglessness) of life and is written in a lucid and engaging style.

[1] Guy Bennett-Hunter, Ineffability and Religious Experience (Routledge, 2014), Ch. 2.

[2] David E. Cooper, 'Life and Meaning', Ratio 18 (2005): 125-37, on 128; The Measure of Things: Humanism, Humility, and Mystery (Clarendon Press, 2002).

[3] See, for example, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, The Phenomenology of Perception, trans. C. Smith (Routledge, 2002), 105.

[4] Leszek Kołakowski, 'The Demise of Historical Man', in Is God Happy? Selected Essays (Penguin, 2012), 264-276, on 264.

[5] Cooper, 'Life and Meaning', 128.

[6] Karl Jaspers, Philosophical Faith and Revelation, trans. E. B. Ashton (Collins, 1967), 340; Bennett-Hunter, Ineffability and Religious Experience, Ch. 5.

[7] Reason and Existenz: Five Lectures, trans. W. Earle (Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1956), 141.

[8] Cooper, 'Life and Meaning', 133-4.