Philosophy in the Modern World: A New History of Western Philosophy, Volume 4

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Anthony Kenny, Philosophy in the Modern World: A New History of Western Philosophy, Volume 4, Oxford University Press, 2007, 347pp., $25.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198752790.

Reviewed by David R. Cerbone, West Virginia University


Anthony Kenny's Philosophy in the Modern World is the fourth and final volume of his series collectively titled, "A New History of Western Philosophy."  I should note at the outset that I have not read the preceding three volumes and so I cannot comment on the extent to which the present volume dovetails with the previous ones, nor can I judge its success at bringing the series to a conclusion.  Instead, I will treat it as a freestanding work, concerned with a particular, fairly well circumscribed era of philosophy.  Without wishing to make a virtue of my ignorance of Kenny's broader efforts, judging the work in this way does serve a purpose, as many readers, owing to their interests or their coursework (Kenny advertises the book as written for "an audience at the level of second- or third-year undergraduate study" [xv]), are likely to want or need to read one volume to the exclusion of the others.  A work like this would not serve these readers' needs especially well if its exposition depended heavily on the volumes preceding it.  Fortunately, this is not the case:  though Kenny is careful to direct the reader to specific discussions in previous volumes, this is done via unobtrusive footnotes that do not interrupt the flow of the narrative, and so the reader may comfortably read just this one volume.

In considering the scope of Kenny's exposition, it is important to note that "modern" modifies "world" rather than "philosophy."  The book thus does not cover what is typically covered in a college course on modern philosophy, which usually ranges from Descartes to Kant.  Consideration of that era in philosophy was included in the third volume (The Rise of Modern Philosophy).  As Kenny notes at the outset, the third volume ended with the death of Hegel, and the present volume continues onward from there to close to the end of the 20th century.  In the Introduction, Kenny recounts his struggles with determining a suitable cut-off point for inclusion in the book:  Can the philosopher in question still be living?  Must he or she be younger than Kenny, who reports being seventy-five?  Rather than use demise or his own age as a criterion, Kenny finally settled on a thirty-year rule, thereby excluding from consideration anything written after 1975.

Drawing the line there still leaves a considerable swath of philosophy to consider and one of the remarkable achievements of this book is just how much it does manage to cover, and with considerable clarity and rigor (though there are some lamentable lacunae, as I'll suggest below).  It is rare indeed that a work in philosophy can move so gracefully from the ethics of Schopenhauer to the logic of Peirce to Croce's aesthetics, but Kenny does just that and a great deal more.  That this is the fourth volume of a comprehensive history of Western philosophy makes Kenny's achievements in this particular book even more astonishing.  The book is eminently readable, though not easy:  as Kenny notes, "philosophy has no shallow end" (p. xv).  Still for those wishing to get their feet wet or to fill in some of the gaps in their understanding of the philosophy of this era, this can be an excellent book.  However, as I'll try to spell out below, there are some unfortunate gaps in Kenny's own exposition, especially for readers whose interests tend toward 20th century continental philosophy:  this audience will have to look elsewhere for filling in those gaps (or, to vary the image, reading this book will leave their feet rather too dry).

The book is divided into twelve chapters.  The first three are what might be called bio-centric, as they briskly survey the years allotted to the book via accounts of (some of) the leading figures.  These more biographical chapters are followed by nine topical chapters, where many of the views and developments adumbrated in the bio-centric chapters are explored and explained at greater length.  Both the bio-centric and the topical chapters give some indication of the sweep of Kenny's gaze, which ranges over topics as diverse as logic and aesthetics (and seven others as well) and figures as far apart as Peirce and Derrida.  Kenny also includes figures -- Darwin, Marx, and Freud, most notably -- whose impact on philosophy has been considerable, but who are not always (or even usually) counted as philosophers.  There is by no means one story to tell about the history of recent philosophy and it is to Kenny's credit that he does not pretend there is.  Whether he tells enough of the various different stories is another matter, to which I will return shortly.

The titles of Kenny's three bio-centric chapters -- "Bentham to Nietzsche," "Peirce to Strawson," and "Freud to Derrida" -- indicate his desire to give a more, rather than less, inclusive account of recent and near-recent philosophy that spans what is taken to be a gap between "continental" and "analytic" philosophy.  Indeed, Kenny is well aware that the idea that there is such a gap is itself only a recent development.  Kenny notes the "cosmopolitan nature" of philosophy shortly before and into the early parts of the 20th century, citing as examples James' studies of French and German philosophy, Russell's correspondence with Frege and Peano, and Frege's own correspondence with Husserl (a page of one of Frege's letters to Husserl is included among the illustrations).  In many ways, Kenny himself strives for this more "cosmopolitan" stance, moving fluidly among many different styles of philosophy.  The title of the first chapter -- "Bentham to Nietzsche" -- is indicative of this cosmopolitan approach, as is the inclusion of thinkers as diverse as Schopenhauer and Mill in one chapter.  (The second chapter, however, entitled "Peirce to Strawson," is far more streamlined, though even here Kenny moves among a wide variety of views, such as Peirce's "pragmaticism," British idealism, logical positivism, and the philosophy of Wittgenstein, among others.  Though the chapter does not take in anything routinely associated with the continental tradition, it is hardly monolithic.)  Much of the ground Kenny covers will be familiar, as it should be, to readers already well-versed in this stretch of the history of philosophy, though even more philosophically sophisticated readers are bound to learn something.  Many more analytically-minded philosophers are unlikely to be very familiar with the views of Schopenhauer, and many of any stripe tend not to be up on the (sometimes very odd) details of Peirce's views.

Unfortunately, the cosmopolitanism characteristic of late 19th and early 20th century philosophy did not survive beyond that point.  In the preamble to the "Freud to Derrida" chapter, Kenny recounts that "by the middle of the twentieth century all this had changed.  Continental and Anglophone philosophers went their separate ways, hardly speaking the same language as each other" (p. 72).  I do not wish to deny altogether Kenny's claims concerning the emergence of a gap between different styles or schools of philosophy in the 20th century.  That certain stripes of philosophers have in recent decades considered it important to think of themselves as unable to talk to those of a different stripe (and these determinations of inability run in more than one direction) is itself an important fact about the history of recent philosophy.  Kenny would thus be remiss were he not to be sensitive to such a gap.  What I find problematic in Kenny's exposition, however, is, first, his estimation of the persistence of this gap, and, second, the extent to which his own narrative exemplifies, rather than just documents, such a gap.

To consider the first of these:  Kenny seems to regard these recent, but deep divisions as standing features of the philosophical landscape, since he claims that "well-meaning attempts to bring together proponents of the different styles of philosophizing met with only limited success in the second half of the century" (p. 72).  This last claim is open to dispute, if one considers the extent to which prominent Anglophone philosophers -- Richard Rorty, Hilary Putnam, Stanley Cavell, John McDowell, and Robert Brandom, to name a few --  have in recent decades variously incorporated or appropriated ideas from both sides of the analytic-continental divide.  Kenny's verdict similarly overlooks or downplays the amount of scholarly and philosophical work devoted to continental figures by more analytically trained philosophers.  The latter work -- exemplified most prominently by Hubert Dreyfus' work on Heidegger -- is typically keen to demonstrate the relevance of continental ideas to ongoing concerns in the analytic tradition.  Though one can dispute the success of any particular approach in philosophy, it strikes me as unfair and inaccurate to deem all of this to be merely "well-meaning."

In defense of Kenny on this score, one could note that much of what I'm appealing to here flouts his self-imposed cut off of 1975.  It is, after all, only in very recent years that we've seen this kind of hybrid approach.  Kenny cannot, I think, be so easily defended against my second complaint.  The nature of my complaint can be initially spelled out in more or less quantitative terms.  Kenny's bio-centric chapter, "Freud to Derrida," contains, in addition to the two figures so far named, portraits of Husserl, Heidegger, and Sartre.  There is some room for complaint here, as no mention, even in passing, is made of such figures as Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Michel Foucault, and Emmanuel Levinas.  This complaint is perhaps only a small one, as no book of this size can include everyone whose views are in some way important or influential, and thus every reader is bound to be disappointed by the exclusion of some philosopher or other.  To my mind, the real problem lies in the fate of the five philosophers Kenny does portray here in the subsequent topical chapters:  with the exception of Freud and Husserl, in the nine topical chapters to follow there is nothing by way of substantive discussion of any of the remaining three figures discussed in this chapter (and I should note that Husserl's views receive roughly three further pages of discussion, while Freud's get roughly five across two separate chapters).  It is as though the 20th century produced a number of prominent philosophical personalities who, oddly enough, had nothing whatsoever to contribute to central philosophical topics.  That there are nine topical chapters following the opening three makes the absence of further discussion of the views of Heidegger, Sartre, and Derrida even more glaring (and that there are more pages devoted to John Henry Newman than to Heidegger and Sartre combined shows that something has gone very amiss here).  If Heidegger is indeed an important 20th century figure, then he should be so for having something important to say about such topics as, say, epistemology, metaphysics, and the philosophy of mind.  (I should also note that Kenny writes about Heidegger as though he only wrote Being and Time and nothing thereafter, i.e. there is no mention, let alone discussion, of what is usually referred to as later Heidegger.  His chapter on aesthetics might have benefited greatly from a short foray into Heidegger's "The Origin of the Work of Art.")  If Sartre is indeed an important philosopher, then he too should have had something important to say.  That Kenny found no place for further discussion of Sartre's views in, for example, the chapters devoted to the philosophy of mind and to ethics does both Sartre and his own exposition a disservice.  In the case of Derrida, it seems clear that Kenny does indeed consider him to be an important figure with nothing important to contribute to the history of philosophy.  Kenny includes Derrida only to deride him, and perhaps to deflate what he perceives as his undeserved fame.  Given the lamentably derisive and dismissive tone of his discussion, perhaps it should not be surprising that Kenny saw no reason to mention him again.

Given these omissions, Kenny reveals himself as yet another product of the gap he documents, and readers will need to look elsewhere to do some filling in.  (To his credit, Kenny's suggestions for further reading do point readers in the right direction.)  A bit of filling in will also be needed with respect to other aspects of Kenny's exposition.  Kenny does not see fit to discuss ordinary language philosophy (J. L. Austin is mentioned only in the discussion of Derrida), even though an entire chapter is devoted to language.  The philosophy of Quine likewise strikes me as underrepresented.  This is not to suggest that Kenny overlooks Quine entirely, as he does Austin and the Oxford School.  Some aspects of Quine's philosophy -- his deflationary views on modality, his indeterminacy of translation thesis -- do come in for discussion (and Quine is also one of those exalted few to have a portrait included among the illustrations, though I must admit that the criteria for the selection of illustrations was not readily decipherable).  There is, however, nothing on Quine's conception of naturalized epistemology (the epistemology chapter ends with a discussion of Wittgenstein's On Certainty), which strikes me as a serious oversight, given the extent to which Quine's brand of naturalism, with its attendant blurring of the distinction between philosophy and science, came to dominate Anglophone philosophy.  Finally, though Saul Kripke is briefly discussed in the section of the logic chapter devoted to modality, the language chapter would have profited from further attention to his (and Hilary Putnam's) notion of direct reference.  With this complaint, though, I am straying awfully close to Kenny's 1975 cut-off, as that is the original publication date of Putnam's "The Meaning of 'Meaning'," and so Kenny can be forgiven the omission, at least to a far greater degree than he can be for downplaying the contributions of 20th century continental philosophers, which, after all, were made well within his declared timeframe.