Philosophy, Literature, and the Human Good

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Weston, Michael, Philosophy, Literature, and the Human Good, Routledge, 2001, 198 pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-415-24338-6

Reviewed by Vincent Colapietro, The Pennsylvania State University


Even given its somewhat restricted focus, Michael Weston has written a very useful introduction to the philosophy of literature, especially insofar as literary works bear upon variable articulations of human flourishing. This book appears to have grown out of a course on “Philosophy and Literature.” Its value is, however, not limited to students, but extends to more advanced scholars interested in exploring (in Arthur Danto’s words) philosophy and/as/of literature. This is especially so given the lucid expositions of a constellation of mostly contemporary theorists who have invited and, in several instances, compelled us to rethink the relationship of philosophy and literature. The author makes his own distinctive contribution to rethinking this relationship.

The value of this volume stems also from the analysis and interpretation of Joseph Conrad’s Lord Jim with which this book ends. The conclusion at which Weston arrives via his consideration of the views of others is perhaps most forcefully stated near the beginning of this final chapter: Literature is “a historically situated exploration of the nature and possibilities of making sense of life …. Literature shows us life as seen, in terms of some perspective, some conception of the nature and possibilities of its significance, even if the latter is of its meaninglessness” (156). What this thesis means in reference to the practice of coming to terms with a literary narrative is spelled out in convincing detail in the final chapter of Philosophy, Literature, and the Human Good. This practice is closely akin to moral reflection and, indeed, simply moral response to self and others. Weston stresses: “We respond to each other and our situation as the individuals we are …. Our response is both perceptive and emotional, or rather we see in terms of the way we care. What we feel is often as significant as what we do” (157). Moral response and reflection are of a piece with literary experience and interpretation: “The novel or play requires of the reader the exercise of this same capacity of making sense of life and so concerns us. We are emotionally involved with the characters, seeing things from their perspectives or from that of the implied author” (157). In other words, we in our encounters with others, either actually or vicariously through literature, tend to become more deeply involved in relationships in which we are already implicated, though ones not necessarily recognized or avowed.

So, too, we can thereby become aware of how complicit we are in the tendencies being exhibited through a literary narrative. The strategy of Lord Jim “invites our assent to what we must then recognize as illusions: the position of the omniscient judge of the first narrator and the romantic stories Jim tells of his exploits” (176). The illusion of omniscience is seen through, as are the delusions of romantic self-aggrandizement: “We are shown to ourselves as desiring to obscure a precariousness in our own self-understanding” (176). Reading Lord Jim is in effect a process of owning up to this desire for obfuscation. Reading Weston’s interpretation of Conrad’s novel is, in turn, an opportunity to appreciate that this lucid expositor of philosophical texts is also an insightful reader of a literary work. It is, thus, regrettable that the earlier chapters offer so few analyses or even references to literary texts. A deep, pervasive irony is the extent to which Weston presents philosophical theories in abstraction from the literary works upon which these theories are supposed to bear.

While resisting the impulse to identify philosophy simply as one branch of literature among other branches, Weston argues for taking the literary articulations of human flourishing to be integral to philosophical interventions in our self-understandings of our inherited practices. He follows closely D. Z. Phillips’s example: the task of the philosopher is not to ground (or validate) practices, but to intervene in our theories of these practices in such a way as to disrupt and neutralize the ill-effects of our deep-rooted tendency to theorize. Literature aids us in making sense of our lives in various ways, not least because it assists us in seeing through tenacious yet subtle strategies of self-deception and also because it exhibits in such a nuanced manner the irreducible complexity of personal transformation. Though philosophy can aid us in making sense of how literature aids us in making sense out of our lives, it all too often devalues or distorts the functions of literature. Part of Weston’s task, accordingly, is to give literary works their philosophical due.

On Weston’s account, literature takes on an importance in the later modern period it previously lacked. Indeed, it comes to play, especially in the twentieth century, a distinctively philosophical role denied to it prior to Immanuel Kant (xii). In particular, literature is not merely illustrative of conclusions reached theoretically; it is principally suggestive of possibilities in danger of being occluded and, in extreme cases, obliterated by the theoretical drive toward defining the human good in abstraction from the concrete practices and contingent circumstances of human beings, caught up especially in what so often are the defining conflicts of everyday life. Literature both keeps alive threatened possibilities (the work of Flannery O’Connor is cited in this regard) and sets forth unanticipated ones. The human good in its irreducible heterogeneity is grounded in diverse forms of life.

One traditional function of literary works, from Homer’s Odyssey to James Joyce’s Ulysses (neither of which merit a mention by Weston), has been to exhibit the conflicts, hopes, horizons, and interactions characteristic and, indeed, constitutive of distinctive forms of cultural life. When questioned from within or challenged by confrontations with alternatives, the felt need to justify one’s renewed espousal or eventual rejection of an inherited form of human life has prompted many individuals, from Plato to Alasdair MacIntyre, to appeal to a transcendent ground. This appeal is consequent upon skepticism, upon radical doubts regarding the validity or viability of one’s form of life. In time, it is also generative of, thus antecedent, to skepticism, since the long history of discredited appeals to a transcendent order, variously envisioned, tends to generate doubts regarding the transcendent as such. Weston’s Philosophy, Literature, and the Human Good is, at once, a critique of traditional philosophy and a defense of the moral life’s singular debt to literary articulations of contrasting visions of the human good. At the heart of this critique is a rejection of transcendence (at least, the theoretical appeals to a transcendent order so characteristic of Western philosophy), whereas an affirmation of the primacy and (in a sense) also the ultimacy of our practices is central to his defense. Hence, Weston insists philosophy “must give up its inherited claim to arbitrate between conflicting forms of life. These conflicts … must be accepted philosophically and left to fight their known battles” (131). The resolution of these conflicts can occur only at the level of their eruption, that of the practices constitutive of our form of life.

In his Philosophical Investigations, Ludwig Wittgenstein suggests: “The work of the philosopher consists in assembling reminders for a particular purpose” (I, #127). Weston intervenes in various theoretical discussions of literary texts by collating reminders for the purpose of showing how often theorists such as Jacques Derrida, Richard Rorty, and Stanley Cavell are complicit in the very position each supposes himself to have worked through and, thus, beyond. He also implies that literature itself in effect assembles reminders of what theorists are prone to overlook or, worse, erase (e.g., xix). Indeed, the principal value of literary works is, for a philosopher of literature such as Weston, to remind us of how moral and religious reflection and change actually occur, by involving us in the tangles and complexities of human lives prone to self-deception yet capable of self-understanding (see, e.g., 143). In Weston’s own words, literature “can explore the nature and possibilities of making sense of life in an appropriate form, in terms of narratives of individuals making or failing to make sense of their lives under specific social and historical circumstances” (156). Moreover, literature clearly does so in a way that tends to avoid the temptation of asserting its vision of life as a truth to be established, once and for all, from a theoretical perspective (i.e., a vantage point by definition secured by systematic dissociation from parochial commitments and personal attachments). The parochial, the local, the mundane, the quotidian, the contingent, the personal, and even the idiosyncratic are, of course, the stuff of literature. Succumbing to what Ludwig Wittgenstein identified as philosophy’s “craving for generality,” traditional Western philosophy typically erases just these aspects of our lives.

The questions and doubts rooted in the everyday circumstances of human beings can be truly radical and, thereby, deeply disconcerting, so much so that we are inclined in some instances to say that humans or their worlds are at the point of falling apart. The vertigo induced by ever more radical doubts is likely to prompt agents to find a way to stop the world from spinning, to steady themselves by clutching something fixed. Our propensity to seek a transcendent fixity by which to counteract our skeptical vertigo is at the heart of Weston’s account of how literature can aid philosophy in eradicating both its unwitting privileging of a specific ethical orientation and its traditional theoreticism (its theoretical ambition to articulate, typically in a universal and necessary manner, the very truth of things). Hence, Weston charges that Stanley Cavell’s perfectionism is less inclusive than it appears to be, for “it would seem to rule out the unconditional commitment of that self [the self open to overthrowing its current form of life], and therefore to rule out certain kinds of moral and religious life” (124; cf. 131). Cavell’s Wittgensteinian beginnings thus do not lead to Wittgensteinian conclusions, since he “seems unwilling to recognize that, in showing the groundlessness of our lives, philosophy must give up its inherited claim to arbitrate between [or among] conflicting forms of life” (131).

Weston sees himself as more consistently Wittgensteinian. He announces in the Preface that he argues for “a certain position in relation to the issues raised, one deriving from the thought of Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein.” The reader discovers in the penultimate chapter that the author’s appropriation or, at least, use of Kiekegaard and Wittgenstein is indebted to how D. Z. Phillips takes up Kierkegaardian and Wittgensteinian themes and strategies in Phillips’s “interventions in ethics” and in the philosophy of religion. Weston stresses, “Phillips’s interventions have often utilized detailed references to works of literature, whose point is not … to provide data for further theorizing, but rather to intervene in the desire for theorizing” (140). The overarching objective of Philosophy, Literature, and the Human Good is to intervene in the philosophical theories of Immanuel Kant, Friedrich Schlegel, Friedrich Nietzsche, Georges Bataille, Maurice Blanchot, Jacques Derrida, Iris Murdoch, Martha Nussbaum, Richard Rorty, and Stanley Cavell, especially insofar as the positions of these theorists on language, meaning, validity, and truth are pertinent to literary articulations of human flourishing.

The movement from one chapter to the next can be construed as a form of “dialectic” (my word, not Weston’s), since the conclusion of each chapter (with the exception of the penultimate one, “D. Z. Phillips: The Mediation of Sense”) is the inadequacy the position presented in that chapter. The author tries to show that each of the positions is inadequate on its own terms: it is complicit in serving the very cause it supposes itself to have overthrown. Allow a single example to show what I mean by this. The final section of Chapter 1 (the only chapter dealing with specific theorists not devoted to a single figure) foregrounds Nietzsche’s critique of Plato’s “otherworldiness.” The realm of Forms is, in Nietzsche’s judgment, symptomatic of “a life in revolt against itself” (15), a life in retreat from this world and thus itself. Against the ideal of the soul who voluntarily submits itself to the moral directives underwritten by a transcendent order, Nietzsche celebrates “the ideal of the most exuberant, most living, and most world-affirming man” (16). Such persons do not evaluate their lives in reference to an external standard, much less a timeless measure; rather they are laws unto themselves, though in a much more radical sense than countenanced by Kant or even Schlegel. The Kantian ideal of autonomy is transformed into the Nietzschean project of auto-poiesis. Life is to be “lived self-consciously as art” (18), since it is continuously to be refashioned as a self-transformative process, accountable to nothing other than itself. But Nietzsche’s advance beyond metaphysics and Plato is more apparent than real: “The ’absolutizing’ of the concepts involved in the expression of the truth of ’becoming’ is a mark of the fundamental complicity of this project with the metaphysical ambition, to occupy a position from which human life (pace Nietzsche’s explicit denials) can be judged” (18). The “finality of the account offered to replace metaphysics” perpetuates the impulse to distance oneself from one’s life in such a way as, in effect, to occupy a transcendent perspective. The availability of such a perspective is, however, illusory: even the most radical questioning of the perspective on life in which we have been reared and with which we identify “proceeds from another perspective on life or is expressive of a loss of the sense of life …” (142). There is no privileged perspective beyond our existential position(s). Hence, at the conclusion of Chapter 1, Weston suggests this possibility: “Perhaps we should learn from this [in particular, from Nietzsche’s failure to extricate himself from the metaphysical] that no such account of a generality to replace the metaphysical can be given” (18). The impossibility here is inherent in language, the incoherence a consequence of thought itself striving to gather itself into an inviolable coherence. On Weston’s account, then, the movement from Nietzsche’s project of self-overcoming leads us to consider Bataille’s account of language’s self-undermining. Hence, the title of Chapter 2 is: “Georges Bataille: The Impossible.”

Though Weston is throughout this book engaged in an extended argument with thinkers ranging from Immanuel Kant to Stanley Cavell, he does so in the hope that his orientation does not compromise the usefulness of his expositions of various figures. This hope is far from vain. Without ever oversimplifying, he presents in a clear, detailed, and insightful manner the views of quite diverse authors, most of these posing difficult challenges to their philosophical expositors. In this regard, his presentations of Bataille, Blanchot, and Derrida are especially noteworthy; students especially are likely to find them helpful. But one of the important respects in which Weston’s approach to the philosophy of literature is surprisingly limited concerns his expositions. In what are otherwise exemplary accounts of these various theorists, he all too infrequently takes into explicit, much less detailed account, how these theorists have taken up in their own writings specific literary texts. For example, a passing reference to Rorty on Proust is supposed to suffice.

One of the other respects in which the scope of this work is restricted is that the chorus of voices assembled here is drawn, with the exception of Chapter 1 (“Life as Art: Kant, Schlegel, and Nietzsche”), from authors who rose to prominence in the second half of the previous century. Indeed, most of the writings upon which he focuses were published in the last quarter of that century. Even so, Weston begins this work by recalling Plato’s announcement that there has long been a quarrel between poetry and philosophy. His narrative of the interplay between literature and philosophy, however, truly begins with Immanuel Kant. For it is with Kant that the philosophical position allegedly rooted in the Platonic persuasion begins to dismantle (xii), if only to a limited degree. While the Introduction provides a map of the terrain to be covered, offering thumbnail sketches of how the author takes up the views of each of the figures, Chapter 1 traces how our conceptions of intelligibility, truth, and validation are revised by three influential German authors in such a way as to accord literature ever greater relevance to philosophy. The following chapters implicitly make this point in reference to other thinkers. Though in some respects forced or artificial, this manner of presentation is especially illuminating in discerning affinities and divergences between, say, Murdoch and Nussbaum or Rorty and Cavell.

As already noted, the development traced in this book takes place against a backdrop. Literature on Plato’s account “plays an essential cultural role in the transmission of values, showing us patterns of excellence in such a way that we are drawn towards their imitation …” (xi). But the patterns of excellence by which we judge our conduct and indeed our lives are themselves susceptible to judgment: we can stand back from them and question their exemplarity and authority. Our capacity to question the culturally transmitted and sanctioned exemplars by which our characters and sensibilities have been decisively shaped seems to generate ever more radical doubts that we are powerless to address rationally. Platonic metaphysics offers a steadying perspective precisely because it rests upon “something beyond human cultures which can judge them, a timeless measure for the patterns of excellence cultures and their literatures present” (xi). Weston asserts that, to the extent such a measure (or set of such measures) exerts its authority within a culture, “literature has no distinctive philosophical role to play” (xii; emphasis added). Religion or philosophy provides access to the transcendent ground of our normative claims, whereas literature either obstructs or facilitates this access. But literature, as fiction, lacks the resources for securing a timeless measure or attaining a transcendent outlook. Its value and power are severely limited by its inability to provide of its own accord access to an order beyond mutability, contingency, and ephemerality.

Kant’s transcendental turn marks the beginning of a break with Plato’s transcendent persuasion. When we move from Kant to Friedrich Schlegel and Friedrich Nietzsche, however, the critique of traditional metaphysics cuts even deeper and thus the appeal to a transcendent ground for our normative claims becomes more suspect. The appeal to the metaphysical is necessitated by “the apparent possibility of sceptical questioning” (1) and the alleged inability of historical exemplars to provide adequate measures of the human good. What happens when either skepticism is embraced or addressed in some other way? That is, what happens when the appeal to the metaphysical ceases to be compulsory or even appealing? “From Kant to Derrida we can trace the development of a tradition of thought which attempts to divest us of this ambition” to transcend human culture and history as a means of authorizing human aspiration and endeavor.

It is, accordingly, curious and perplexing when Weston himself appears to appeal to the transcendent as a way of counteracting the impoverishing effects of a purely secular and historicist ethics. In his discussion of Phillips, he claims: “A way of life, in order to give reason to life, must not be valued for what is expected within life, within the temporal, but is rather that which gives the temporal its value” (144; cf. 157). Weston is quick to point out that the relation to the “eternal” is only one historical contingency; but he appears to be especially keen to keep this possibility alive. Though he stresses that “the notion of the ’essence’ of morality is a chimera” (the reason being that the meaning of the ’moral’ is to be discovered in how the term is used, in what role the term plays in our lives), it is hard to resist the conclusion that, for him, ethics and religion stripped of any relation to the “eternal” will be effectively effaced.

At a quick glance, it might appear that Weston takes into consideration a wide range of philosophical perspectives. A more careful look does not entirely overthrow this impression. But there is a deep irony in Weston’s almost complete neglect of primarily literary writers who are nonetheless engaged in philosophical reflection upon the intertwined practices of writing, reading, interpretation, and critique. (Iris Murdoch is the obvious exception here.) Following the lead of Phillips, Weston traces our traditional theoreticism to “abstract reasonableness.” But literature and certain styles of philosophizing enable us to guard against the snares of such reasonableness by placing “the notion of ’reason’ … within its lived context” (143), by returning rationality to its everyday home in our actual practices. “In moral theories, language is ’on holiday’: moral concepts are removed from the contexts where they have their use” (141). Literature supposedly shows us some of the ways language actually functions in our lives.

In a sense not intended by Wittgenstein or Weston, literature typically involves language on a holiday. One might even argue that, in one sense, the value of literature is that it licenses language to go on a holiday, to depart from its narrowly circumscribed routines and tightly bound references (cf. 68). In another sense, however, those who are accustomed to accompanying everyday language on its literary holidays are especially helpful for appreciating both how rich, subtle, and powerful is everyday language, precisely in its ordinary usages, and how pliable, supple, and yet dense, even opaque, is an inherited language in its literary transformations. The cause of returning linguistic rationality to the lived contexts in which such rationality is at home is served by joining those who long have been fighting a guerilla war against the linguistic imperialists protecting the sovereignty of Theoria. It is especially surprising that Weston feels so inclined to go it alone in his own campaign.

One also gets a sense of the unacknowledged limits within which Weston conducts his nonetheless useful inquiry (or intervention) by randomly recalling some obvious – and relevant - names to mind. Italo Calvino has written memorably about The Uses of Literature, as Umberto Eco has explored painstakingly The Role of the Reader and The Limits of Interpretation. The reflections of Virgnia Woolf, W. H. Auden, Vladimir Nabokov, Seamus Heaney, Salman Rushdie, Dylan Thomas and countless other authors on their craft and sullen art are worthy of the most careful consideration, not only by literary theorists but also by philosophical “interventionists.” One might also mention those of James Baldwin, Octavio Paz, Toni Morrison, and Mario Vargas Llosa. Indeed, a somewhat different selection of philosophical authors and literary examples would have resulted in making the political and even the disruptively erotic dimensions of our lives as visible as the religious and intimately interpersonal. This is, of course, too easy. No matter how many theorists an author included one might always identify ones arguably of equal stature and importance to those included. Yet, given the emphases and orientation of this book, the voices of literary authors disposed to reflect philosophically on the artistic practices and cultural institutions in which they are implicated deserve greater attention by philosophers of literature than do those of theorists who typically treat topics at an appreciable distance from the concrete particulars of how literary texts are crafted by authors and engaged by readers.

Of course, it would be foolish to try to be too inclusive. But the principles of selection, hence those of exclusion, governing Weston’s choices seem more tightly tied to the neatness of his dialectical narrative than finely attuned to the heterogeneity of contemporary literature. Contemporary works of literature deserve something approximating comparable attention to contemporary theorists of literature, especially given Weston’s own orientation. What philosophy can make of literature needs to be more widely and deeply concerned with what literature, including authors such as Joyce, Woolf, Nabokov, Borges, and Calvino, has made of language. Closely allied to this, philosophy (or some other discourse) needs to show how intimately connected are the ways literary authors turn language upon itself and the ways life turns upon itself in the endeavors of human agents, in contingent circumstances, to attain their singular vision of the human good (cf. 152).

In his Philosophical Investigations, Wittgenstein identified a “main cause of philosophical disease” to be “a one-sided diet: one nourishes one’s thinking with only one kind of example” (I, #593). Though somewhat varied, Michael Weston’s examples are too limited. Lord Jim is, for all its narrative complexity, only a precursor to modernist and distant precursor to postmodernist experiments in fictive narrative. Yet even an introduction to the philosophy of literature should accord these experiments systematic, if abridged, treatment. The chorus of voices assembled in this book, though it ranges from Immanuel Kant to D. Z. Phillips and juxtaposes Jacques Derrida to Iris Murdoch, conveys too narrow a sense of both how literature variously functions and how literature has been variously conceived. The heterogeneity so prized by Weston himself is as evident in the forms and functions of literary texts, also the styles and methods of philosophical approaches to literary works, as it is in the irreducibly diverse visions of the human good he is so keen to safeguard. There is more in philosophy – and literature – than is even nominally acknowledged in this introduction to the philosophy of literature. Despite these limitations, this readable, informative, and insightful book should prove to be useful to diverse audiences.