Philosophy, Neuroscience and Consciousness

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Rex Welshon, Philosophy, Neuroscience and Consciousness, Acumen, 2011, 389pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773538429.

Reviewed by John O'Dea, The University of Tokyo


This is a book about the prospects for reducing consciousness to brain processes, in the light of the current state of scientific research on the brain. Its purpose is to "introduce and discuss" the obstacles to such a reduction, both philosophical and empirical, rather than present a sustained argument. On the philosophical side, the main obstacles are the possibility of emergence, multiple realizability, and externalism. The main empirical evidence brought to bear on these problems is the correlations between attributes of various conscious states and activity in certain brain structures and networks. In general, though there is a lot of good and useful material in it, the book has some weaknesses. Although the collation and exegesis of quite a lot of neuroscience is impressive and welcome, its relevance to the problem of reduction is not always obvious. The over-arching dialectic of reduction -- specifically to "properties of neural assemblies" -- tends to outweigh the discussions of traditional philosophical problems of consciousness (theories of qualia, intentionality, etc.) to the extent that its connection with the philosophical literature on consciousness is more tenuous than the title and back cover might lead one to expect.

The summary below picks out the main threads of the book, as it seemed to me. Given that it is already synoptic in character, this was not easy. Most of the minor debates, many interesting in themselves, I have left unmentioned.

Welshon characterizes consciousness (Chapter One) as any event, state or process that is (1) intentionally structured, (2) qualitatively endowed, and (3) subjectively perspectival. The issue that drives the remainder of the book is whether any or all of these properties can be reduced to the properties of neural assemblies. Neural reductionism (NR) is defined (Chapter Two) as the following thesis:

Physical events or parts thereof exhaust everything that is concrete and there is a supervenience relation between all families of conscious properties and microphysical properties of neural assembly activity such that subvening microphysical properties of neural assembly activity are the only realizers of supervening conscious properties. (pp. 45-6)

Explaining this and related possibilities requires a tour through the relevant parts of philosophy of science and the metaphysics of mind: reductionism, supervenience, multiple realizability, mental causation, and so on. Emergentism is presented (Chapter Three) as the main alternative to reductionism. Chapter Four, switching gears somewhat, introduces representationalist approaches to consciousness, in the form of representational approaches to each of the three "conscious properties" above: intentionality, qualia, and subjectivity.

Part Two is an attempt to summarise all the neuroscience that could be relevant to the issues raised in Part One. Though I have some quarrels with some aspects of the exegesis, an impressive amount of work has gone into this. Chapter Five concerns the human brain as a whole, in terms of general structure, comparisons with non-human animals, and the debate over modularity. Chapter Six describes the neuroscience relevant to perception and emotion. Chapter Seven deals with the neuroscience of more "cognitive" processes -- attention, working memory, language and executive functions -- which have all been associated with consciousness (executive functions through a connection with metacognition). Finally, Chapter Eight describes neural theories of consciousness. These are divided into "vehicle" and "process" models; for the former, but not the latter, intrinsic properties of the neural assemblies responsible for consciousness are necessary for the instantiation of consciousness. The quantum mechanical theory of consciousness is an example of a vehicle theory; the main process theories discussed are Bernard Baars' Global Workspace Theory and Edelman and Tononi's Dynamic Core Hypothesis.

Part Three attempts to use the neuroscience introduced in Part Two to make progress with the issues raised in Part One. Following a discussion of the problem of localization, Welshon weighs the neuroscientific evidence for dissociations between intentionality, qualia, and subjectivity (Chapter Nine). Philosophers of consciousness may find this chapter a frustrating read, as it contains some rather sweeping statements; for example, that the phenomenon of blindsight shows that the intentional content of visual perception can be retained in the absence of qualia (p. 215), while the phenomenon of daydreaming (among others) shows that the qualitative character of an experience can be retained in the absence of content (or at least "accessible" content, where the significance of this crucial qualifier is not explained) (p. 216). This is, I think it fair to say, an unusual reading of the evidence.

Chapter Ten discusses the relationship between the concepts of correlating with, being a substrate of, implementing, being constitutively sufficient for, realizing (in a core, total, or differential way) and reducing. The bulk of the chapter is taken up with the issue of multiple realization, the problem being that A reduces to B only if B is both sufficient and necessary for A. Welshon argues that this is essentially an empirical issue, to be solved by comparative studies between species and persons; the issue remains open, he thinks. This is certainly a departure from the received view. One might think that the possibility of artificial consciousness is relevant here, but for somewhat unclear reasons, Welshon takes it that the whole discussion can be relativised to a domain. For example, self-powered flight, being a purely functional property, can presumably be realized by certain kinds of wings or propellers. But animals use only wings; "If so, then self-powered flight is not multiply realized in animals" (p. 233).

Moreover, Welshon is interested only in nomological possibilities ("strong enough for our purposes" p. 34), which are discovered empirically. Consequently, the question of whether consciousness could possibly be realized in an artificial, non-biological system is moot: "we are interested instead only in the more prosaic question, are conscious properties multiply realized in our actual world?" (p. 61) That being the case, "Philosophical reflection alone cannot show that multiple realization is true." (p. 239) Where standard textbooks discuss the problem of multiple realizability, Welshon eschews this for the problem of multiple realization. This makes the importance of empirical findings more obvious, but at the cost of rendering the importance of the issue itself considerably less so. It is not clear, for example, what Welshon's stance is towards those who are working towards the creation of artificial (or machine) consciousness. These researchers are committed to the proposition that consciousness, though actually implemented by networks of neurons, could be implemented in other kinds of physical systems. Are they wasting their time, if consciousness reduces to neural systems based partly on the fact that the only current examples of consciousness are implemented neurally? Welshon declares himself to be uninterested in that possibility, but the reasons behind this lack of interest seemed insufficiently explained.

Chapter Eleven deals mainly with causation and emergence, the general thrust being that there is a sense of emergence that is metaphysically harmless and some or all conscious properties could be emergent in this sense. Chapter Twelve, the final substantive chapter, discusses externalism. Welshon begins by drawing a distinction between a particular conscious event and the various conscious properties (intentionality, qualia, subjectivity) associated with it. This distinction maps on to the vehicle/content distinction in the case of intentionality (i.e., roughly the distinction between what is doing the representing as opposed to what is being represented). Content externalism and the extended mind thesis are examples of, respectively, "property externalism" and "vehicle externalism". In the end, "the relevant sciences" are called in to adjudicate the issue in relation to content and qualia externalism, though it was not clear to me what kind of experimental evidence would be relevant.

In terms of structure, the idea of separating the book into its three parts -- philosophy, neuroscience, philosophy in the light of neuroscience -- sounds reasonable but in practice involved lots of flipping backwards and forwards. I think that the book would have worked better, in the sense of being easier to follow, had the neuroscience been introduced alongside the philosophy. An integrated approach would also have shortened the amount of neuroscience the reader is asked to digest. Since Part Two is written as a general primer on the relevant neuroscience, there is a lot of neuroscience introduced that is not used in Part Three.

In general, the book is on its surest ground in the discussions more central to traditional philosophy of mind than specifically on consciousness; issues to do with supervenience, emergence, mental causation and so on. Whereas distinctions and sub-distinctions are carefully drawn in respect of these issues, consciousness-related distinctions are drawn less carefully and not always consistently. Qualitative properties are introduced in Dennettian fashion ("neither private, ineffable, nor incorrigible" p. 10), but frequently discussed in incompatible Blockean terms (in which privacy presents a significant epistemological problem). The distinction between having intentionality and representing, made clear in the beginning, is not always adhered to. The distinction between access and phenomenal consciousness, correctly introduced early, is run together with the content/qualia distinction in Chapter 9.

The book is described on the back cover as an introduction to neuroscience for philosophers and to philosophy of mind for cognitive scientists. Non-philosophers will find it a challenging read; a familiarity with modal second-order predicate logic is assumed in the explanation of property identity. Elsewhere, statements of principles (such as NR above) are couched so to allow straightforward conversion into symbolic logic -- to the extent, for example, that "and" is used in favour of "but" in these statements, even when natural English mandates the latter (Chapter Twelve in particular). In addition, Welshon tends to give short shrift to points of view with which he is unsympathetic. This tone is set in the Introduction:

Any crank can announce that the rest of the world labors under a mistaken paradigm that only he is astute enough to see, and philosophy has more than its share of cranks. The history of the discipline is littered with private languages and idiosyncratic world-spinning, worth reading for occasional insights or a system's internal coherence but disconnected otherwise. That kind of philosophizing and those kind of philosophers are not our concern. (p. 5)

Given Welshon's dislike of non-actual possibilities (i.e., thought experiments), I occasionally had the impression that his definition of crank philosophizing might be quite broad.

The focus on "neural assemblies" leaves an obvious gap in the book's coverage of the science, since little space is devoted to the other levels (cognitive and computational) at which a further mountain of empirical work on consciousness is being done. But I rather imagine that incorporating those extra levels would have rendered this book impossible to finish. It was already a major challenge to write a book that seeks essentially to combine two substantial fields of inquiry. For the fact that it does not succeed as well as one might hope, some blame must certainly go to the difficulty of the task, which is perhaps the main reason that there are few books like this and why, finally, one must admire the attempt.