Philosophy of Biology

Placeholder book cover

Brian Garvey, Philosophy of Biology, McGill-Queen's University Press, 2007, 274pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773533431.

Reviewed by Maureen A. O'Malley, and Daniel J. Nicholson, University of Exeter


Although philosophical examinations of the living world can be traced at least as far back as Aristotle, the philosophy of biology as an institutionalized academic discipline has a relatively short history. Its origins are usually dated back to the late sixties and early seventies, when philosophers such as David Hull and Michael Ruse began to flesh out the implications of the Modern Synthesis for a philosophical understanding of biology. Since then, the philosophy of biology has grown rapidly to establish itself as one of the core research areas in the philosophy of science. During the 1980s and 90s, several philosophy of biology textbooks appeared, and the past year has witnessed a dramatic surge in the number of such books and anthologies. Brian Garvey's Philosophy of Biology (2007) is among these most recent contributions. Its accessible writing style suggests that the book is intended as an introduction to the discipline for students with no prior knowledge of philosophy or its application to biology.

Despite its title, potential readers should be warned that Garvey's Philosophy of Biology is not so much a textbook of the philosophy of biology as it is a textbook of the philosophy of evolution. Using as a framework Dobzhansky's dictum that "nothing in biology makes sense except in the light of evolution", Garvey considers all interesting biological questions to be evolutionary questions, and all distinctively biological concepts to be evolutionary concepts. He expands on this core thesis in fourteen chapters, which can be classified thematically into three clusters. The first cluster deals with the philosophical foundations of evolutionary theory and covers the arguments in Darwin's Origin of Species (Chapter One), the importance of genes for evolution (Chapter Two), the units of selection debates (Chapter Three), adaptationism (Chapter Four), and the role of development in evolution (Chapter Five). The second cluster discusses some philosophical issues arising from evolutionary theory, namely those of innateness (Chapter Six), function (Chapter Seven), classification (Chapter Eight), and species (Chapter Nine). Finally, the third cluster addresses the broader implications that evolutionary theory has for philosophy of science (Chapter 10), epistemology (Chapter 11), religion (Chapter 12), psychology (Chapter 13), and ethics (Chapter 14).

The book begins with a neo-Darwinian account of the theory of evolution and some of the modifications that the theory has undergone since Darwin's original formulation. Garvey situates himself firmly within the orthodox neo-Darwinian camp as a defender of the "Hamilton-Williams view of evolution", and takes the ideas of Richard Dawkins and Daniel Dennett as his major intellectual resource. Despite the evolutionary focus, numerous aspects of evolution are not addressed. There is little on genetic drift and neutral evolution -- as might be expected from an adaptationist neo-Darwinian perspective -- but more surprisingly, there is barely any analysis of population genetics or the concept of fitness. If Garvey short-changes evolution at the biological level, however, he does not at the psychological and cultural. Following Dawkins and Dennett, natural selection is presumed to constitute a "universal acid" which corrodes our traditional conceptions and compels us to embrace a "Universal Darwinism" that can be applied to all manner of substrates, including ideas (memes), cognitive abilities, and ethical intuitions.

When challenges to neo-Darwinian gene-selectionism are brought up, Garvey's view of evolution allows him to overcome disagreements and arrive with relative ease at straightforward resolutions for many enduring controversies in evolutionary biology. Chapter Four, for example, sets out to examine the claims made by Stephen Jay Gould and Richard Lewontin in their well-known critique of adaptationist thinking (1979). Garvey suggests that although Gould and Lewontin think they are proposing an "alternative vision of what evolutionary biology could be" (p. 55), their primary achievement (from Garvey's perspective) is to function as a reminder that adaptationist explanations should acknowledge non-adaptive factors, such as constraints (p. 62). Overall, Garvey finds Gould and Lewontin's critique "a bit vacuous" and their proposed alternatives to adaptive explanation empirically unproductive (pp. 62-3). He follows a similar strategy in Chapter Five, where he examines evolutionary developmental biology (evo-devo) and developmental systems theory (DST). He introduces evo-devo as "the new buzz-word in the air" (p. 65), and concludes that it is perfectly compatible with a gene-centric view of evolution, in which genes are "in the driving-seat of both development and evolution" (p. 77). He then contrasts evo-devo with DST, described as "a holistic view of evolution" (p. 87), but notes that DST, unlike evo-devo, "has not yielded much in the way of empirical findings" (p. 88).

Both these discussions are prematurely concluded on the basis of limited investigation. There is no mention of the range of different syntheses of evo-devo in relation to evolutionary theory (e.g., Robert 2002; Gilbert 2003), nor of the relationships between evo-devo and DST, and between DST and biological research (e.g., Oyama et al. 2001; Griffiths and Gray 2005). What is made clear by Garvey's evaluation, however, are his two strategies of resolving challenges to neo-Darwinian orthodoxy. The first is to subordinate the competing position to gene-centred evolutionary theory (e.g., evo-devo, and Gould and Lewontin's non-adaptive factors), and the second -- if the first fails -- is to dismiss the new position because it does not constitute an empirically successful research programme (e.g., DST, and Gould and Lewontin's "alternatives to adaptationism").

A number of other philosophical arguments that Garvey discusses in his book are evaluated on the grounds of whether or not they are scientifically successful, by which he means 'fitting the facts'. In essence, facts jump out of nature and it is the role of scientists and philosophers to identify them. It is only after we have possession of the 'true facts' that we can settle the disputes of science and philosophy of science. An example of this epistemic stance can be found where Garvey explains why Darwin's theory of evolution is scientifically successful whereas the theories of Lucretius and Lamarck are not: "both Lucretius's and Lamarck's theories fall down in virtue of having to appeal to factors for which we have no evidence. Darwin's theory succeeds by appealing to factors that we can see really exist" (p. 4). Garvey makes similar cases in relation to concepts such as canalization, generative entrenchment, and population typicality. The biological success of these concepts, says Garvey, is due to the fact they really exist (p. 105).

Another telling example can be found in his discussion of biological categories in Chapter Eight, where Garvey takes the universal tree of life as one such 'fact' made evident by science. "One of the salient facts about biology that is explained by evolution," he notes (p. 127), "is the existence of a branching tree of life: a set of categories in which every organism finds its proper place … dictated by facts about the organisms themselves". For many representations of evolutionary relationships, an ever-bifurcating species tree of common descent is presumed to capture both the process and the pattern of evolution. Such assumptions are made deeply problematic by microbial molecular phylogenies, in which vertical descent is often obliterated by horizontal acquisitions of genetic material. Garvey's claim that "the deeper into a creature's structure one goes" (p. 134) the higher the reliability of classification is simply not the case for microbial phylogeny that uses 'deep structure' data. The more that is known about genome structure, the less reliable (in the sense of telling a single story) microbial classifications become. For at least some molecular phylogeneticists the tree of life is at best a hypothesis and much more frequently a representational mistake (e.g., Doolittle and Bapteste 2007), rather than a 'fact' given by nature. Although a tree of cells exists in Nature's history book, it is for the most part inaccessible to human knowledge. Of course, this does not mean that evolutionary trees cannot be constructed, but rather that 'the one true tree' is neither the cause (as Garvey would have it) nor the effect of phylogenetic reconstructions.

Garvey's oversimplified epistemology is also reflected in the lack of historical and historiographical sensibility in his presentation of scientific claims. In our view, the history of science provides the necessary context for a proper understanding of the meaning, development, and relevance of scientific debates and the philosophical issues which arise from them. Garvey's philosophical treatment of biological problems is unblushingly presentist, except when present-day understandings support non-neo-Darwinian interpretations of evolution. Contrast, for example, his treatment of Darwin with that of Gould and Lewontin. Whereas Darwin's position is declared important and right because he identified 'true' and 'real' phenomena, Gould and Lewontin's position is dismissed as unimportant and wrong, despite the fact Garvey is later forced to acknowledge the importance of their ideas in the contemporary context of evo-devo.

Other evolutionary debates are frozen in the glory days of adaptationist neo-Darwinism and resolved according to what Garvey believes should be the scientific consensus on the matter. Take, for example, Garvey's total neglect of contemporary understandings of eukaryote genome evolution, which have profound consequences for gene-selectionist neo-Darwinian adaptationism. In the words of Michael Lynch, the author of The Origins of Genome Architecture (2007), "most aspects of evolution at the genome level cannot be fully explained in adaptive terms, and moreover … many genomic features could not have emerged without a near complete disengagement of the power of natural selection" (p. xiv). Because so remarkably little contemporary biology is included in the book, the 'consensus' Garvey ends up relying upon is not, in general, the present consensus for many communities of biologists.

But it is not just the biology that is outdated. Much of the philosophy of science that Garvey presents in the book is also surprisingly out of touch with recent developments. In Chapter 10, for example, Garvey argues that the formulation of laws is "something that every science ought to aspire to", given that "we expect scientific explanations to explain things by means of laws" (p. 160-1). These statements suggest that Garvey is unaware of the recent turn in the philosophy of science represented by Machamer, Craver, and Darden (2000), who view mechanisms, not laws, as the central resources that scientists draw upon to explain phenomena. Even if that omission were to be ignored, Garvey's discussion of laws in biology is likely to be too limited for many readers. There is little examination of the notion of scientific law, and no discussion at all of John Beatty's "evolutionary contingency thesis" (1995), which has become the standard starting point for all contemporary examinations of this topic. Instead, Garvey's primary objective in his discussion of laws in biology is to defend the claim made by Dawkins that "biology is a more unified science than physics" (p. 157) because even though it lacks laws, it is unified by the theory of evolution (p. 175). Put another way, evolutionary theory provides for Garvey the "ontological unification of biology", which explains his evolutionist commitments and their pervasion of the book.

Overall, Garvey's Philosophy of Biology is more a survey of old philosophy of biology literature than a fresh attempt to think philosophically about familiar biological problems in a way that is informed by recent scientific developments. This, coupled with the fact that the philosophical treatment is for the most part rather elementary, leads us to conclude that anyone already familiar with the philosophy of biology literature is unlikely to find much in Garvey's book that is new or useful. A whole range of important biological areas not directly related to evolution are not even mentioned: cell biology, ecology, physiology, immunology, neurobiology and microbiology, as well as newer areas like systems and synthetic biology. Moreover, there is not only not enough biology but also not enough reflection on recent theoretical discussions of evolutionary biology (e.g., Wilson and Wilson 2007; Pigliucci 2007; West-Eberhard 2005; Rose and Oakley 2007; Millstein 2006; Plutynski 2007) to make the book a good resource for (evolutionary) biologists with philosophical inclinations.

Ruling out philosophical and scientific audiences leaves the uninitiated student wishing an elementary introduction to philosophy of biology as the sole target of the book. However, given Garvey's restricted framing of the field, the book's usefulness as a teaching aid is questionable. We think that it is generally more helpful for introductory texts to describe complex philosophical debates in a balanced and open-ended way in order to encourage students to think for themselves about the issues and develop their own arguments. Garvey's pre-emptive treatment leaves hardly any of the major issues in the philosophy of biology he discusses 'unresolved', and we suspect that when used in the classroom it may simply encourage students to believe that some of the ongoing debates in the field have been unproblematically settled by the Dawkinsian neo-Darwinian position. For Garvey's book to serve as an introduction to philosophy of biology for the new student, it would need to be heavily complemented by a much greater range of perspectives on the philosophy of evolution and biology.

Although Garvey's treatment of philosophy of biology is too restricted for most potential readers, a dissection of its limitations may stimulate some constructive thoughts regarding the way in which new teaching texts might approach philosophy of biology. Despite the appearance of a large number of textbooks on the philosophy of biology in recent years, it is noticeable that none of them has attempted to offer an account of what the philosophy of biology actually is. If not a philosophy of evolution, is philosophy of biology a philosophy of life itself, or is it a philosophy of biological science as it is actually practised? Should the philosophy of biology restrict itself to describing the conceptual problems encountered by biologists, or should it also attempt to influence and transform the way biologists think about the problems they encounter? We believe that what the discipline needs, in addition to updated syntheses of the core debates in the field, is an examination of the way the field is configured, a dissection of its central programmatic objectives, and an exploration of its epistemic relation to biological science, the history and philosophy of science, and perhaps even the public understanding of science. In our view, these sorts of issues would constitute useful starting points for any new books on the philosophy of biology, as well as provide helpful correctives to the unreflective recycling of old or limited debates.


Beatty, J. (1995). "The Evolutionary Contingency Thesis." In G. Wolters and J.G. Lennox (eds.), Concepts, Theories, and Rationality in the Biological Sciences. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press (pp. 45-81).

Doolittle, W.F and Bapteste, E. (2007). "Pattern pluralism and the Tree of Life hypothesis," Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences USA 104: 2043-2049.

Gilbert, S.F. (2003). "Evo-devo, devo-evo, and devgen-popgen," Biology and Philosophy 18: 347-352.

Gould, S.J., & Lewontin, R.C. (1979). "The spandrels of San Marco and the Panglossian paradigm: a critique of the adaptationist programme," Proceedings of the Royal Society London B 205: 581-598.

Griffiths, P.E., & Gray, R.D. (2005). "Three ways to misunderstand developmental systems theory," Biology and Philosophy 20: 417-425.

Lynch, M. (2007). The Origins of Genome Architecture. Sunderland, MA: Sinauer.

Machamer, P.K., Darden, L., & Craver C. F. (2000). "Thinking about mechanisms," Philosophy of Science 67:1-25.

Millstein, R.L. (2006). "Natural selection as a population-level causal process," British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 57: 627-653.

Oyama, S, Griffiths, P.E., & Gray, R.D. (2001). Cycles of Contingency: Developmental Systems and Evolution. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Pigliucci, M. (2005). "Do we need an extended evolutionary synthesis?" Evolution 61: 2743-2749.

Plutynski, A. (2006). "Drift: a historical and conceptual overview," Biological Theory 2: 156-167.

Robert, J.S. (2002). "How developmental is evolutionary developmental biology?" Biology and Philosophy 17: 591-611.

Rose, M.R., & Oakley, T. H. (2007). "The new biology: beyond the Modern Synthesis," Biology Direct 2: 30 doi:10.1186/1745-6150-2-30.

West-Eberhard, M. J. (2005). Developmental plasticity and the origin of species differences. Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences USA 102: 6543-6549.

Wilson, D.S., & Wilson, E.O. (2007). "Rethinking the theoretical foundation of sociobiology," Quarterly Review of Biology 82: 327-348.