Philosophy of Emerging Media: Understanding, Appreciation, Application

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Juliet Floyd and James E. Katz (eds.), Philosophy of Emerging Media: Understanding, Appreciation, Application, Oxford University Press, 2016, 466pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190260750.

Reviewed by Val Dusek, University of New Hampshire


This work is a genuine contribution to showcasing philosophical thought about big data and the internet, (including e-mail, Skype, and social media, such as Facebook and Snapchat, among other platforms). It also includes discussion of less novel media, such as photography. It treats various media without basing itself solely on a single postmodern or Heideggerian approach, as do many cultural studies works on the topic. It utilizes Anglo-American linguistic philosophy, a variety of French approaches and a bit of process philosophy. This work is much more philosophical than most recent books on media since Hubert Dreyfus' and Michael Heim's books, both based primarily on Heidegger.

Whereas much of the discussion in emerging-media and contemporary-communication studies is based on postmodernist sources, the authors of this work, while they discuss several postmodernist figures in brief references or for several pages, rely on a much broader sampling of philosophers. In most of the essays philosophers from very different schools are utilized to approach a topic.  The editors have supplied an excellent, synoptic Introduction and "Coda" or afterword. There is also a concluding interview on big data with Gary King. The geographical range of authors is extensive, as is the variety of philosophers and philosophical positions treated.

Earlier work on mass media such as film and radio by Theodor W. Adorno and Max Horkheimer of the first generation of the Frankfurt School is not discussed. It is mentioned once briefly in an essay dealing with postmodernists and Habermas in order to note that they are focused on older media unlike the figures the article discusses. Clearly, this is not because their work is half a century old, as Walter Benjamin is extensively discussed.

Given the great range of philosophical theories covered it is surprising that American pragmatism is not discussed or utilized. A philosopher of signs and symbols who receives only a few brief mentions is Charles Sanders Peirce. His analysis of the triadic sign relation, as well as his classification of icons, indexes, and symbols, would seem to have been worthy of inclusion, especially given that such a range of figures is discussed. John Dewey's instrumental account of language is likewise not mentioned or used.

The book, intentionally for the most part, omits considerations of the technology of the internet, computer ethics, and political issues concerning the new media. The authors intentionally omit consideration of inequality, liberty, law, psychology, ethics, ecology and ethics. Also, 1960s sociology is dismissed. There are, however, plenty of other works that deal with these subject matters. The book concentrates on epistemology, semiotics, and metaphysics.  The introduction discusses the importance of big data for the emerging media. However, with the major exception of the interview with Gary King, big data does not play a big role in the other chapters.

The book description on the back cover mentions technological determinism, but this topic doesn't appear directly anywhere in the book. Nor do some other standard topics in the philosophy of technology, such as autonomous technology. One issue that might have been raised relative to Habermas is whether the internet involves instrumental action or communicative action.

The concern signaled by the title is emerging media. However, there is an ambiguity in the term 'emerging.' The more common use of the term connotes the novelty of the new media. There is another use of the term in philosophy of biology and philosophy of mind (the latter a major focus of the authors) that refers to the non-reducibility of an entity, theory, or field to simpler or more basic entities and/or theory. Four of the articles focus on emergence in this second, more philosophical, sense. There is a connection of the two meanings of emergence, since the appearance of a new phenomenon, not predictable or explicable from knowledge of its predecessor or components, is tied to emergence. Five of the articles (those by Juliet Floyd, John Haldane, James E. Katz and Elizabeth Robinson, Peter Simons, and David Ramsay Steele) discuss emergence in the sense of non-reducibility. Floyd, Simons, and Steele are skeptical about the claim that new media are emergent in the philosophical sense. Maurizio Ferraris (p. 71) allows that the internet, like the termite mound and the brain, is a superorganism, but denies, like Steele, that there is a collective consciousness, and uses Daniel Dennett's evolutionary psychological explanation of such systems. Katz and Robinson defend the epistemological but not the ontological emergence of the new media. Their sense of emergence is that the new characteristics lead us to conceptualize and categorize the entity in a new way. This seems a weak sense of emergence. Usually epistemological emergence involves the inability to account for the new entity on the basis of its components.

The account of the emergence versus reduction issue is less extensively developed than the temporal novelty issue. There is less connection than what would be needed to make a distinction between emergence in the sense of a new level of organization and "emerging media" as a new phenomenon.

There is a throwaway mention of Pierre Teilhard de Chardin and the noosphere, the level above the geosphere and biosphere. This idea, deriving from the Russian geochemist Vladimir Vernadsky and the unorthodox priest Édouard Le Roy, in turn inspired several people in the early development of the internet. H. G. Wells' global brain was another early proposal for this sort of thing. True, the noosphere and global brain ideas were sketchy and preceded the internet by decades, but it is too bad that the book does not offer more development of the historical, positive accounts of the global communications network as a genuinely new level of organization above and beyond the individual participants and nodes. Talk of emergence and complexity is relatively frequent in discussions of computer theory and it applications, such as the work of John H. Holland (Hidden Order, Emergence). Though this is discussed by Haldane, it would have been better if other contributors had taken up this sort of discussion of emergence. Systems such as boids (with patterns of flight for bird flocks based on simple rules) or John Horton Conway's game of life are rightly or wrongly often claimed to be emergent in discussions of complexity theory.

Steele's "Will Emerging Media Create a Collective Mind?" presents a systematic anatomy and critique of the notion of the internet as a collective mind. He considers different relations of the individual minds to the supposed collective mind. One arrangement would be that the collective mind subsumes all the individual minds, as with the Borg. Another is that the collective mind operates over and above the individual minds and may be thinking thoughts entirely different from theirs. A third version is that the individual minds contribute to and participate in the group mind.

Steele distinguishes intelligence from consciousness, though the two are often identified in accounts of the collective mind. Steele, who has favorably contrasted the ideas of Ludwig von Mises to those of Marx, argues that the market cannot have a mind of its own, and indeed, following Marx here, claims that the market is unintelligent and anarchic. Yet the von Mises and Hayek thesis is that the market makes adjustments that cannot possibly be made by a conscious planner. But assuming the market is far more efficient and far-seeing than any conscious planner, why not attribute to the market a mind of its own, making "the mind of the market" no longer metaphorical?

Haldane's "Media, Emergence and the Analogy of Art" makes some odd statements about the role of emergence. These are probably related to the notion of creation ex nihilo and are likely related to Haldane's use of Aquinas. Haldane writes that if emergence is so powerful that even God could not know it, then there is nothing to know. Then there is a suggestion that emergence is really related to divine intervention. This seems to go beyond Aquinas on novel forms or qualities.

The discussions of emergence for the most part treat relational emergence rather than organismic emergence. Relational emergence is a function of the complex network of relations between the elements of the system. It is a less extreme form of emergence than organismic emergence, which is the claim that that the whole is 'more than the sum' (or assemblage of relations) of the parts, or produces a higher level of organization, entities or laws. This latter form of emergence is for the most part rejected here. Besides the articles on non-reductive emergence, a number of articles discuss the semantics and pragmatics of communication on the emerging media.

Among the many interesting articles is Bruno Ambroise's "Speech Acts and the Internet: Austin to Bourdieu and Fraenkel", where Ambroise discusses the relevance or inadequacy of J. L. Austin's speech act theory to non-speech media utterances, such as pokes on Facebook. Rather like the later part of Plato's Phaedrus, discussed elsewhere, written forms of communicative acts seem to be treated as inferior, just as they are not treated at any length in Austin. Ambroise claims that the felicity conditions of non-oral performative utterances are different from those of oral ones. Technology conditions are involved in contrast to oral speech acts. The pragmatics are also different because of the longer duration of written speech acts.

John Grey's"Semantic and Pragmatic Stances toward Emerging Media" looks at the emerging media and references Paul Grice and George Lakoff among others. Grey notes how in expressions of moods and attitudes on Twitter or Facebook, in contrast to e-mail or written letters, the different semantics affect the pragmatics. He suggests that iChat and Snapchat have the same semantics but have very different pragmatics, since images and texts on iChat don't rapidly disappear the way those on Snapchat do. The brevity of the Snapchat image's duration may focus attention and engage the memory more than iChat. Grey suggests that describing moods or emotions on Facebook may have less emotional weight because they are directed to a population of friends rather than to an individual.

Floyd's "Turing, Wittgenstein and Emergence" develops Turing and Wittgenstein in terms of their notion of the interface between the formalism and the interpreter. She gives a very clear summary of the history of logic leading up to Turing's theory of computation. She surveys both the encounters between and the similarities in interests of Wittgenstein and Turing, whether it be in sequences of human acts or in the "offloading" of various procedures into mechanical algorithms that lessen the need for conscious reflection and allow human skill to be applied to other tasks. Floyd argues that Turing purposively sidestepped general metaphysical issues. She sees Turing as interested not primarily in pure formalism, despite his great achievement in this area, but in human activities where there is  rule following in everyday procedures. Thus she denies the usual interpretation of Turing as saying that the mind is a computer or as a materialist mechanist. Rather, according to Floyd, Turing, like Wittgenstein, is ultimately concerned with everyday reasoning and its rules.

Ronald E. Day's "Philosophy of Critique: the New Media" looks at the role of critique with respect to the new media. He briefly treats the views of Kant, Heidegger, Deleuze, Derrida, Baudrillard, and Habermas and applies them to the new media. As with other contributors, Day leaves out the notion of critique in the first generation of critical theory. He notes that the philosophers discussed by him for the most part either predated the emergence of the new media or dealt explicitly only with it in brief remarks. He also attempts to strike a balance between the utopian view of the internet as our salvation ("The California Ideology") and negative accounts of the new media.

All in all, this book is an excellent introduction to the philosophical issues concerning the emergent media. The breadth of philosophical scope and the variety of philosophical positions applied to the issues make it particularly valuable. It opens numerous paths to further development of genuinely philosophical approaches to the media from a varied menu of approaches that utilize most contemporary philosophical schools. The necessarily limited length of the chapters means that much needs to be developed on each topic, but the work is excellent in offering ideas for further development and application.