Philosophy of Exaggeration

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Alexander Garcia Düttmann, Philosophy of Exaggeration, James Phillips (tr.), Continuum, 2007, 182pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826495624.

Reviewed by Maria Granik, College of the Holy Cross


Alexander Garcia Düttmann's Philosophy of Exaggeration is a provocative and original book that engages a remarkably wide variety of thinkers in recent Continental Philosophy.  Düttmann insists that exaggeration is a central concept for many of these figures, including Adorno, Arendt, and Althusser, among others.  For example, Adorno "repeatedly formulates" the idea that thought and exaggerations are connected in a way that is fundamental for both (15) and Althusser argues that exaggeration "belongs essentially to philosophy" (51).  Yet, no systematic work devoted to exaggeration in philosophy exists.  Düttmann sets out to correct this omission, while conceding that no systematic definition of exaggeration is possible.  As a result of this tension, his book is often an experiment in style.  Most of the essays making up the book have been published before, but they have been revised to form an elusive but coherent whole.  The reader will not find a unifying narrative or argument in the traditional sense of the word, but each one of the eleven chapters is devoted to connections between exaggeration and another concept (e.g., irony, infinity, and trauma) or practice (e.g., philosophy, politics, and art).  The scope of this inquiry is broad, and its author's familiarity with 20th century European philosophical landscape quite extraordinary.

Throughout the book, Düttmann evokes the need for "restraint in the face of explanation," insisting that traditional philosophical analysis is powerless in the face of exaggeration and that, consequently, style and content cannot be easily separated when writing about exaggeration (6).  In the introductory chapter, Düttmann discusses the work of Schuyler, a poet and art critic, who writes about an American painter, Fairfield Porter.  According to Schuyler, "the critic does not judge the work he reviews," instead he or she simply shows "what is there" in the work (13).  This immediacy in perception is difficult to achieve because, as Düttmann observes, "once attention is given to the immediate, attention for its part ceases to be immediate" (14).  However unattainable it may be, immediacy is Düttmann's ideal in treating the philosophical texts that inform his positions: he tries to let them speak.  Similarly, he invites the reader of his book not to judge and evaluate, but rather to experience the ideas.  The philosopher aims at what Düttmann at one point calls self-evidence "without analysis" (106).  His book is an example of philosophical prose that embraces this ambitious task.

"Nothing should be named lest by doing so we change it" is a phrase from Virginia Woolf's novel The Waves that Düttmann describes as an instant aphorism.  He writes: "The sentence by virtue of its unexpected self-evidence is understood immediately" (67).  Indeed, Woolf's phrase is striking in just this way.  Attempting to grasp (both to understand and to use) this power of words, Düttmann himself offers a number of instantly revealing statements.  Take, for example, his description of the book's main theme: exaggeration.  "Every justified exaggeration is no longer an exaggeration" (15).  Here, Düttmann captures the main challenge of his project in one masterful stroke.  If the task of philosophy is to provide justifications, then exaggeration is a particularly difficult idea to tackle philosophically.  Yet, Düttmann makes a powerful case for the intrinsic connection between philosophy and exaggeration.  Citing Arendt, Adorno, and Derrida, among others, he shows time and again that thinking is essentially bound up with attempts to go beyond the limits of the thinkable.

The main danger in writing about exaggeration, then, is domesticating it, failing to capture its resistance to analytical explanation.  In another insightful observation, Düttmann further elucidates the difficulty of expressing new ideas.  He asks: "Does not habit, however, forget the new with such swiftness that it seems almost inconceivable how something that yesterday would have been considered wholly impossible is today already accepted as self-evident … ?" (p. 139).  Düttmann is vigilant not to let the reader become complacent or too comfortable with the ideas s/he encounters.  He aims to avoid rigidity: "the new is similar to truth in that, if it is to become an ally, one should not attempt to appropriate its forces, to seize hold of them or to usurp them" (141).  We are reminded here of Nietzsche's (in)famous opening lines of Beyond Good and Evil: "Supposing truth is a woman -- what then?  Are there not grounds for the suspicion that all philosophers, insofar as they were dogmatists, have been very inexpert about women?"  Düttmann is no dogmatist.  For instance, the concluding section of the chapter on exaggeration and philosophy, headed by an epigraph from Don Giovanni, describes the narrator's experiences in a sex club in a Melbourne suburb (26-27).

At the same time, Düttmann's writing is careful.  He is aware of the need to preserve rigor in the pursuit of exaggeration.  What he says of Adorno's writings, holds true also of his own: "Such unregulated argumentation, such disunity of thought with itself, should of course not be equated with arbitrariness" (136).  As part of the effort to avoid arbitrariness, Düttmann provides readings of passages from Heidegger, Freud, Deleuze, Derrida, and many others.  In doing so, he seeks to ground his claims in the philosophical tradition which first recognizes the significance of exaggeration for thinking.  The references to various figures (Düttmann's impressive erudition takes us beyond philosophers to novelists, poets, and artists) can be overwhelming at times, particularly since some names are not immediately recognizable and Düttmann does not always bother with introductions.  However, they do give a scholarly foundation to Düttmann's often playful writing style.

The project of analyzing exaggeration, a concept that by its very nature resists all justifications, is riddled with contradictions.  In one particularly telling example, Düttmann rails against academic conventions of (American) book publishing:

Model and trademark of compromised thought and art are the certificates adorning the back covers of American books, the brief panegyric called a blurb, and the naïve and simultaneously calculating expressions of gratitude that, extending over several pages and commandeering footnotes, settle the author's debts.  (115)  

His own acknowledgements are rather unorthodox: printed in a box above the text of the introduction, they mention no names but contain some personal reflections on exaggeration instead.  The back cover of the book, however, does carry traditional endorsements by several German newspapers.  Can we hold it against Düttmann as a kind of hypocrisy?  I don't think so.  But we should appreciate the fine line that he attempts to walk in undertaking this ambitious critique of conventions.  He acknowledges the paradox inherent in denouncing book publishing by publishing a book about it, in attacking conformism using a more or less traditional medium of philosophical discourse.  The title of his chapter devoted to exaggeration and institutions -- "blow job" -- is meant, perhaps, to reflect this paradox.

Several common themes hold together Düttmann's stylistically and theoretically diverse investigations.  I will mention two that seem particularly central.  In his introduction, Düttmann identifies an essential ambiguity in deconstruction.  He asks whether deconstruction is merely a reminder of the "transcendental illusion" that haunts our self-understanding or whether it actually transforms "every practice and every way of life".  A similar dilemma seems to haunt Düttmann's analysis of exaggeration.  Is it concerned with the nature of thought or does it also have important political implications?  Düttmann often calls our attention to the inseparability of the two spheres.  Thus, the first theme that informs his reflections is the relationship between thought and life.  According to Düttmann, both are grounded in a relation to excess: thought to exaggeration, ordinary experience to trauma and breakdown.  A quote from Adorno's Minima Moralia captures the spirit of Düttmann's project well: "Knowledge comes to us through a network of prejudices, opinions, innervations, self-corrections, presuppositions and exaggerations, in short through the dense, firmly-grounded and by no means uniformly transparent medium of experience" (135, my emphasis).

The second (closely related) important theme of the book concerns the role of language in human experience.  Düttmann writes: "[G]iven that the living exaggerate, given that they invent poetry in order to shield themselves from the names that first come about through poetry, the dealings with names are always a struggle for life and death" (73).  His reflections on language are informed by a Lacanian understanding of language (although Lacan is only mentioned once in a footnote).  At one point, Düttmann writes: "Using language means not being in control if it" (70) and when discussing the notion of trauma, he points out that language is not socially constructed, but rather experience is constructed in significant ways by language (92).  These observations about language figure prominently in many parts of the book; for example, they have important consequences for Düttmann's treatment of queer identity, particularly in the chapter on exaggeration and irony (entitled "Odd Moves" after an expression used by Judith Butler when discussing homosexuality).

Although it can be difficult at times to distinguish Düttmann's voice from those of the authors he cites, the book makes for very rewarding reading.  Its insights stay with you for a while, making this work thought provoking in the best sense of the word.  One concern with the text is the occasional employment of overconfident parallels between art and philosophy on the one hand and life on the other.  For example, Düttmann identifies killing with compromised thought and art when using Benjamin's idea that "The killing of a criminal can be moral -- but never its legitimation" to attack conformism in thought and art (111).  To be sure, this is an exaggeration.  However, the parallel needs some qualification.  Although I often found myself following Düttmann's exaggerations quite willingly, this movement between theory and practice seemed to abandon rigor for virtuosity.  Granted that exaggerations cannot be justified, they need to remain compelling.

Consider also the frequent references to airplanes.  Düttmann builds one chapter entirely on the trajectory of a flight (it is appropriately titled "Flight Simulator"): it is complete with sections like boarding, taxiing, take-off, turbulence, and final approach.  Breaking this familiar sequence, however, is a section entitled "Crash" that precedes the section on boarding.  This passage describes a 1996 crash of a TWA flight from New York to Paris: a reference, by omission, to the attacks of 9/11 (discussed elsewhere in the book).  The chapter concludes with a criticism (or more precisely an endorsement of another author's criticism) of the injunction "never to forget" the Holocaust.  Such insistence on remembering, Düttmann fears, might perpetuate trauma.  He is clearly weary of excessive piety in the face of horror, and his warning is worth taking seriously.  Yet, I wonder whether his impiety is at times unwarranted.  For example, Düttmann writes using the diary form in the concluding chapter: "I am someone who plants bombs" (145).  In the same section, he writes that "literature is a bomb tearing down the everyday" (148).  I find the ideas expressed here compelling, but in passages like these, Düttmann embraces the rhetoric of violence too uncritically.  The "bombing metaphor" is not sufficiently rooted in an intuition; as a result, it fails to be a convincing exaggeration.

Overall, Philosophy of Exaggeration is an admirable effort to combine rigor and creativity, philosophical reflection and artistic expression.  Düttmann aims to illustrate both "the splendor and misery of exaggeration," as the title of his introduction attests.  In fact, whether exaggeration is good or not "cannot be decided on the basis of principles but must show itself in specific objects" (14).  Düttmann's book is not (and does not intend to be) the final word on exaggeration, but an invitation to question the concept anew.