Philosophy of Finitude: Heidegger, Levinas, and Nietzsche

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Rafael Winkler, Philosophy of Finitude: Heidegger, Levinas, and Nietzsche, Bloomsbury, 2018, 151pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350059368.

Reviewed by Ingo Farin, University of Tasmania


The book explores crucial themes in Heidegger, Levinas and Nietzsche, primarily centred around the problem of death and dying (chapter one), self and other (chapter two), figurations of being (chapter three), dwelling (chapter four), truth and error (chapter five), and the concept of substance (chapter six). With the exception of the last chapter, Rafael Winkler shows how Heidegger, Levinas, and Nietzsche, as well as Derrida and Ricoeur (not mentioned in the subtitle, but very present throughout the book) are key-players in the still ongoing debate about: (1) the nature of the subject, (2) the limits of thought and experience, and (3) the human dependence on and responsibility for the earth on which we dwell as mortals, neighbours, strangers and guest friends, always mindful of the dead, while, at the same time, seeking to establish a historical home fit for human society.

As he explains in a brief introduction, Winkler takes the concept of "uniqueness" -- that which escapes all categorizing and identification -- as the prism through which he aims to explore death and mourning, dwelling, hospitality, and responsibility in the face of the other, the friend, or Being itself.

But there are at least three distinct takes on "the unique" in his book. First, the dominant meaning throughout denotes the unique as the singularity of a person or subject, or "the non-replaceability of a life" (xiii). Here, "the unique" has an ethical connotation, broadly speaking, for it points to the possible or actual violation of the uniqueness of a life or a person, namely, when we take others or ourselves as replaceable, classifiable, and identifiable, etc.

Second, Winkler also refers to the "the unique" as a formal-ontological category, denoting a "purely formal feature of existence" as such, the mere "haecceity of a being," its pure and as yet unqualified, non-identified "being there at all" (xiii, xv). As he puts it, "when nothing more can be said of it [the something whatsoever, IF] except that it is, then and only then does it stand apart and shine through in the singularity of its existence" (xiv). The sheer something, even prior to its diremption into "someone" or "something" (xiv), is the formal-ontologically unique, the "absolutely other," "the anonymous" or the absolutely strange (xiv).

Although Winkler is aware of these two distinct takes on the unique and even uses this distinction throughout the book, he is, in my view, not sufficiently clear about the full significance of this distinction. For instance, while there is a certain sublimity, strangeness, or otherness in the sheer existence of something that escapes all categorization, identification, etc., which can result in a feeling of awe, shock, or disorientation, as Winkler notes, it is doubtful that the particularly ethical response to the unique, in the encounter of the stranger, the orphan, and the widow, or the relation to one's own death or the mourning of a friend, can be adequately described or subsumed as a specific case of what is unique in the purely formal-ontological sense.

Moreover, Winkler introduces a third dimension of the meaning of "the unique," when he writes that his purpose is "to justify . . . the belief that the unique is everything or, to put it more precisely using one of Plato's expressions, that the unique is to ontos on, the really real" (xii). It is unclear how such a project could avoid prioritizing the formal-ontological meaning of the unique at the expense of the genuinely ethical concept of singularity. Moreover, it is equally unclear how such an undertaking could be achieved without a discussion of nominalism and its long tradition. But there is not a hint of that, and, in the end, Winkler nowhere develops this systematic ontological idea, dropping it for the much more modest idea to highlight differences and commonalities in Heidegger, Levinas, and Derrida through the lens of "the unique," clearly taking it as a limit-concept.

In the first chapter, "Death, the Impossible," Winkler pursues three intersecting objectives. First, accepting Heidegger's claim that anticipating one's own death can initiate an utmost singularization at the limit of one's life (11), Winkler contests that the experience of the imminence of death is so shattering and forever elusive that it is bound to dissolve "every kind of unity and identity" in Dasein, without, however, thereby annulling the very experience of it (7).

According to Winkler, Heidegger actually affirms such a position in his lecture "What is Metaphysics?" when he argues that in anxiety we not only lose our grip on the world because it slips away from us, but that we also experience a loss of the "I." He quotes Heidegger's summary of the uncanny experience of anxiety:

At bottom therefore, it is not as though 'you' or 'I' feel ill at ease [nicht 'dir' und 'mir' unheimlich ist]; rather, it is this way for some 'one' [sondern 'einem' ist es so]. In the altogether unsettling experience of this hovering where there is nothing to hold onto, pure Da-sein is all that is still there. (15)

As Winkler rightly notes, this is different from Heidegger's account in Being and Time. But does it really follow that Heidegger here suggests that "the I vanishes," as Winkler puts it (15)? After all, the Da-sein in the human being that experiences anxiety remains intact, and Dasein is determined by Jemeinigkeit and care for itself, even if that mineness is often not very pronounced or foregrounded, or perhaps even weakened.

Second, although Winkler argues that anxiety in the face of death is an overwhelming and shattering limit situation that singularizes Dasein and leads to its disintegration as an identical self, he insists that this experience of dissolution can be had, albeit not "owned", by the authority of the "first person," because precisely this "identity" is undermined by the experience of death. Thus, Winkler argues that an experience is possible even in the absence of an intact "unity of the first person" (1). In defending this view, Winkler goes on to attack Dan Zahavi's account of the necessary unity of consciousness, for which he heavily draws on testimonials of schizophrenic patients (taken from Laing's The Divided Self). But since these testimonials operate with the conspicuous presence of the word "I," thus always presupposing what is said to be absent or shattered (16-17), I fail to see how Winkler can make good his argument on that basis.

Moreover, Winkler's further claim that because of the disintegration of the personal self, brought about by the anticipation of one's death, authenticity and resoluteness in the face of death is impossible and that, therefore, "I cannot own my existence authentically" (1) before death is certainly in need of much more substantiation, because this result flies in the face of everything Heidegger has written.

However that may be, Winkler's third objective is to claim that even though my own death is entirely disorienting and shattering, namely as an always outstanding, imminent but never present "event," it is not, as Derrida would have it, an impossibility in such a way that death comes home, so to speak, only through the death of a friend, i.e., in mourning over the death of the irreplaceable friend (20-24). Since Winkler is primarily focused on the unique, he is quite content with simply noting that Derrida's account of mourning is just as much a genuine figure of the singularizing of death, i.e., the death of a singular and irreplaceable friend, as is Heidegger's account of anxiety in the face of my own death, which singularizes my own Dasein. That is certainly true, but this observation alone does not help to settle the issue, i.e., whether Heidegger's or Derrida's analysis of death is more compelling.

In the second chapter, "Self and Other," Winkler continues his exploration of the unique in human life, that is, in its manifestation in the call of conscience (Heidegger) and the summons of the other (Levinas). According to Winkler, the decisive difference between the two is that while Heidegger's call issues from inside Dasein calling it to its unique self, the summons calls me from outside, singling out the other in his or her absolute singularity. In other words, for Heidegger there is an internal "ontological alterity" at the very heart of Dasein itself, whereas for Levinas there is an "ethical alterity of the other" external to the subject (41).

In this context, Winkler also discusses Ricoeur's attempt in Oneself as Another to find a middle ground between Heidegger and Levinas. Ricoeur suggests that the call at the heart of Dasein must be interpreted as the internal acknowledgment or attestation of the obligation to the other, as a response to an injunction. This would make the call genuinely ethical, which it is not in Heidegger. At the same time, it would anchor the call in the subject's binding itself to its obligation to the other, in contrast to Levinas' merely externally founded summons by the other. As Winkler points out, such a position would also support more recent attempts by François Raffoul and Françoise Dastur to derive the alterity of the other from the ontological alterity within Dasein.

However, in contrast to this attempted rapprochement, Winkler argues that "there is no phenomenological or hermeneutical justification" for holding the view that in assigning myself responsibility for my actions (in and through the call), I am already enjoined by the other outside, such that "the injunction of the other" would already reside in me (45). Put differently, there is no way that one can "transpose the vertical relation that structures the interiority of the self onto the social relation between the self and the other" (45.) Binding oneself to the call of one's conscience is not isomorphic with the response of the call coming from the other, and the singularity of Dasein (in acknowledging the call of conscience) is distinct from the singularity with which the other addresses me (46).

The third chapter, "Figurations," explores the idea of absolute alterity or uniqueness, this side of all particular ethical considerations and obligations owed to the other. Winkler starts out by noting that Heidegger's concept of metaphysics and Levinas' concept of ontology have much in common (48-50). Both concepts refer to a totality of entities and beings, fully present, and represented in the understanding, such that whatever falls outside the parameters of theoretical cognition or the metaphysical grasp of entities, is excluded and relegated to nothingness. What thus falls by the wayside is the absolute other that resists integration into the same (Levinas) or the metaphysical totality of beings (Heidegger). Thus, at the limit of ontology or metaphysics emerges "the thought of absolute difference" which eludes all contextualization, anticipation, and rational control (49). It is the unique in its pure form, not an identifiable being, but a mere "figuration of being" (54), prior even to the diremption of beings into "someone" and "something," or "what" or "who" (55).

Winkler holds that Heidegger's concept of the Event or Being, as distinguished from beings, points to such absolute difference, for Being or the Event is not a being. It is the absolute other that "is" withdrawn and stays hidden, a secret in the midst of all the positivity of entities. In his own way, Levinas thinks through the absolute other too, this side of the same, when he discusses the feminine as non-identifiable, non-reducible, non-assimilable to the same, antedating the home, into which, however, she welcomes the host, preparing the home as "the place of exile and refuge," for the guest and the stranger, thus enabling human dwelling or habitation (59). Winkler suggests that Levinas' conception of "the withdrawal of the feminine" is in an import sense a "rethinking of the withdrawal of Being in Heidegger" (59).

As a third attempt to think absolute difference, Winkler points to Derrida's concept of the "absolute arrivant," which is an unconditional and unqualified hospitality towards the future (61). The upshot is that underneath their many surface differences, a careful reading can identify the commonality of the deepest thoughts in Heidegger, Levinas, and Derrida.

This is further elaborated in chapter four, "Dwelling," where Winkler by way of an extraordinarily refreshing reading of Heidegger's lectures on Hölderlin establishes Heidegger's very own version of hospitality (Gastfreundschaft), the welcome of the stranger into one's home, as the proper response to the challenge to found what its homely on the self-secluding earth. Quoting from Heidegger's lectures on Der Ister, Winkler shows that Heidegger knows that "the appropriation of the proper is only as the encounter and guest-like conversation with the foreign" (83).

Chapter five, "Beyond Truth," delves into Derrida's and Heidegger's interpretations of Nietzsche's conception of the limits of metaphysics and truth. Assuming a middle position, Winkler critiques Derrida's reading of Nietzsche for "its excessive focus on play and irony" (102), while, correlatively, he takes issue with Heidegger's conspicuous neglect of just this side in Nietzsche (96). However, Winkler's suggestion that Nietzsche did not give up the idea of truth, but rather, endorsed an epoché "in a manner similar to Husserl's suspension of the natural attitude" (87), needs much more elaboration, for it is hardly consistent with Nietzsche's view that by "abolishing the true world" we have also done away with "the apparent world."

Chapter six, "Substance," abruptly departs from the main line of inquiry in the previous chapters and provides a doxographic account of the emergence of the technical term substance or substantia in Roman philosophy. While Winkler notes that it is part of the common understanding that substantia translates the Greek term ousia, he points to the new Roman reality with its emphasis on rhetoric, public conflicts and courts to resolve them as a decisive background that shaped the usage of the term. In the forensic context, the term substantia refers to what a dispute is about, the subject matter of the case and this forensic meaning reinforced the philosophical use of substance (125).

While it is unclear how this insight contributes to the interpretations offered in the earlier chapters, the reader will note that in the course of this discussion Winkler also touches on the Stoic concept of the supreme genus, the something as such (120). This obviously relates back to Winkler's initial inquiry into the unqualified singular, but oddly enough Winkler does not engage this issue at all in this chapter. (Incidentally, Winkler also misses Heidegger's own discussion of the "something" as such in §20 of Zur Bestimmung der Philosophie.)

In conclusion, although the book has some merit in highlighting the real proximity between Heidegger, Levinas, and Derrida, the various observations and theses Winkler advances are of varying quality, and some need to be elaborated in more detail and with more justification in order to be persuasive.