Philosophy of Language and Webs of Information

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Heimir Geirsson, Philosophy of Language and Webs of Information, Routledge, 2013, 190pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415640657.

Reviewed by Gregory Bochner, Università di Bologna/Université Libre de Bruxelles


This book is an essay on reference and cognitive significance in the philosophy of language (and mind). It defends the -- nowadays rather vivid -- claims (i) that some version of direct reference theory is true, and (ii) that direct reference theory is compatible with some descriptivist account of cognitive significance. Geirsson's central aim is to argue for a particular version of claim (ii): a theory of cognitive significance involving what he calls webs of information. Webs of information are basically like mental files or dossiers of information: they serve as repositories for descriptive items of information gathered by the subject about what she takes to be individuals. Geirsson's key idea develops the neo-Russellian theme that one and the same singular proposition may be believed in different ways: the different guises under which a singular proposition may be believed correspond to different webs of information. But whereas more traditional accounts of mental files argue that the role of a (non-descriptive) mode of presentation is played by the syntactic vehicle under which the information is stored, here it is instead the information contained in the web that is claimed to play the role of a (descriptive) mode of presentation. Accordingly, cognitive significance is supposed to be explained by the -- admittedly highly idiosyncratic -- items of information contained in the various relevant webs. These descriptive items are the relevant guises. Syntactic markers such as names, although they do not explain cognitive significance, still play two crucial roles, one semantic and the other psychological: (a) they determine that the relevant semantic contribution is directly some particular individual, and (b) they evoke specific webs in the mind of the subject, thereby eliciting information from them.

The book is divided into eight chapters. Chapter 1 introduces the familiar anti-substitution intuitions giving rise to Frege's puzzle and presents an overview of the book. Chapter 2 reviews Frege's account of cognitive value and examines its connections to Kripke's epistemic argument against Fregean descriptivism, concluding that this argument does indeed establish that the descriptions commonly associated with names, since they need not be true of the objects referred to, do not encapsulate a priori knowledge of the referent. Chapter 3 maintains that mental contents are structured propositions, not merely sets of possible worlds, and argues, against Evans and McDowell, that the cognitive value of mental contents should not be individuated by object-dependent modes of presentation. Chapter 4 urges that a Fregean account of belief reports is doomed to failure, in part because it does not guarantee that belief reports have public and determinate contents. Geirsson has a critical discussion of rival referentalist theories of Nathan Salmon, Scott Soames, Mark Crimmins, and Mark Richard. He then introduces a generality constraint -- which is not to be confused with what Evans (1982) called by the same label -- imposing that a good theory should yield a unified solution to all cognitive significance puzzles, not only to those tied to belief reports, but also to those arising from, e.g., images, scents, or tactile feel.

Chapter 5 examines a famous argument by Keith Donnellan against the claim that (contingent) singular propositions can be known a priori through acts of stipulation alone. Geirsson defends (with Donnellan, and against Robin Jeshion) that, whereas a name may be introduced for some specific object x through purely descriptive reference-fixing stipulations and then subsequently used to express singular propositions about x, acquaintance with x will be necessary to gain full apprehension -- or, as Salmon would put it, specific understanding -- of those singular propositions. Chapter 6 lists and explores five cognitive significance problems arising for beliefs and belief reports -- the multiple belief problem, the consistency problem, Frege's puzzle, the translation problem, and the no name problem. After a critical discussion of related accounts by David Braun and Jennifer Saul, Geirsson proposes to solve these problems by invoking psychological confusions between semantic intuitions concerning reference or extensions, and epistemic intuitions concerning descriptive items found in the associated webs of information.

Chapter 7 focuses on empty names, arguing that utterances containing them express incomplete propositions but nonetheless possess a full-fledged cognitive value in virtue of the descriptive items available in the underlying webs, which may include an existence presumption. Finally, Chapter 8, following a neo-Russellian idea sketched by Donnellan and later developed by Kai-Yee Wong, defends that, provided that justification is required for knowledge, a singular proposition may be known at once a priori (under one guise) and a posteriori (under another guise). Granting that epistemic profiles should thus be relativized to particular guises, Geirsson adds that the different pieces of justification corresponding to different guises answer to descriptive items present in different webs.

The book is pleasant, well-written, remarkably clear, and conveniently concise. Unnecessary technicalities are avoided, and the arguments are stated very explicitly so that the text will be beneficial to nonspecialist readers. The professional philosopher familiar with the issues will sometimes want to skip quite long summaries of well-known debates. Moreover, she will perhaps feel that while historical points are often presented in much detail, other substantive issues that would appear to be crucial for the positive theory offered in the book are somewhat neglected. For instance, the exegesis in Chapter 3 assessing whether Frege himself intended his senses to be descriptive or non-descriptive was rather long considering that this historical point has already been discussed extensively, and often with similar conclusions (e.g., Salmon 1990). And it was somewhat disappointing that so little attention was paid to the real, substantive issues between current advocates of descriptive and non-descriptive modes of presentation, such as mental files. Moreover, it is not obvious why so much space (two chapters) is devoted to belief reports, given the early (13-15) -- and legitimate -- emphasis on a generality constraint. Overall, my impression was that the positive, new theoretical import of the book, which really starts on page 116, is relatively thin.

There are two issues amongst the substantive ones that I think could have been addressed in much more detail in the book, given its purpose and the current intellectual context.

The first concerns differences between the descriptivist theory of webs of information and current accounts invoking non-descriptive guises or modes of presentation, such as mental files (e.g., Recanati 2012) or dossiers of information. Geirsson very briefly mentions (118) mental files, only to say that accounts based on them fail to distinguish between central and peripheral information, whereas webs -- whose label explicitly refers to Quine's holism -- afford this contrast. But first, the distinction is equally available to advocates of mental files: the various items featuring in a dossier of information could arguably receive different weights and be more or less "dominant." And second, as advocates of non-descriptive senses like to emphasize, arguments in the last five decades targeted not only the semantic view that descriptions fix the reference -- a view rightly dismissed in Chapter 2 -- but also against the cognitive claim that objects are presented under descriptive modes of presentation, as opposed to non-descriptive modes of presentation. Notably, the problem of the essential indexical (e.g., Perry 1979) suggests that, for all non-indexical descriptions of myself the F, I can always doubt that I am the F, so that I and the F should have different cognitive values. But then, it would -- at least prima facie -- seem that the cognitive significance of I-thoughts cannot be explained by descriptive modes of presentation. If, as Geirsson rehearses with right and force throughout the book, theories of cognitive significance must respect a generality constraint, then one priority should be to address crucial issues like this for a descriptivist view of guises.

The second concerns differences between the descriptivist theory of webs of information and other descriptivist accounts of modes of presentation currently on the market, such as two-dimensionalism. Geirsson focuses very heavily on pragmatic accounts of belief reports, according to which the relevant guises are not part of semantic content and anti-substitution intuitions stem from a confusion between semantic intuitions about what is said and pragmatic intuitions about what is implicated. Although he -- legitimately -- distances himself from such pragmatic accounts, often on the ground that they cannot meet the generality constraint, his own positive account closely resembles them, because it invokes some systematic confusion between some semantic content which is singular and some psychological information which is descriptive (e.g., 118, 136-139). This kind of confusion is also what two-dimensionalists gesture at; they hold that intuitions of cognitive significance are explained by some underlying descriptive content believed to be true of the referent and somehow confused with a corresponding referential content. Hence, an interesting question would be: what differences are there between a web of information and a relevant descriptive belief invoked in -- the non-semantic versions of -- two-dimensionalism?

I shall conclude with two qualms about the positive account.

The first concerns the explanatory virtues of descriptively enriched propositions. As Geirsson notes (62), his psychological account owes much to the pragmatic view developed by Soames (2002). The common view -- appositive descriptivism, as this might be called -- is that, in Frege-cases, a singular proposition such as that Hempel is Hempel is confused with a descriptively enriched proposition such as that my neighbor, Peter Hempel, was the famous philosopher, Carl Hempel. Yet, as Geirsson himself writes,

in entertaining [such descriptively enriched propositions], we are also entertaining the [corresponding singular] proposition . . . since . . . different ways of entertaining the [singular] proposition carry with them different descriptive contents, each of the propositions has different cognitive significance. (62-63)

So the account purports to explain the cognitive significance of attitudes towards singular propositions through some descriptively enhanced proposition: "It is this mechanism of descriptive enhancement that explains our antisubstitution intuitions" (64). That is, on his account, the descriptively enhanced propositions should generate the anti-substitution intuitions by impeding the relevant inferences. One common problem for Soames and Geirsson is that any such descriptively enriched proposition will be true at a subset of the possible worlds relative to which the original singular proposition was true. Hence, instead of helping to foresee which referent is at issue by reducing some superset of plausible candidates, grasp of a descriptively enhanced proposition, since this also and already contains the individual, merely presupposes grasp of the corresponding singular proposition. But then misrecognition of a singular proposition can hardly be explained by such descriptively enriched propositions. A more plausible view, suggested in most varieties of descriptivism, is that discovering the truth of the singular proposition is to exclude possibilities in which different referents, other than the actual referent featuring in the corresponding singular proposition, satisfy the description.

A second and related qualm concerns the explanatory power of the positive theory presented in the book. Geirsson makes clear that, on his view, a subject creates a web for what she takes to be a single thing (cf.,118-123, 125, 129, 135). Yet, the mechanism underlying the creation of webs, and thereby identities/differences between them, is not explained and remains obscure. The fact that sometimes subjects take one thing to be two -- or two things to be one, or no thing to be one, etc. -- is precisely what is puzzling. Accordingly, theories of such cognitive puzzles should explain what it is to take one thing to be two. It is true, as the author suggests, that typically the subject who mistakes one thing for two things will have two different webs or pieces of descriptive information for the same thing. But the fundamental question is: in virtue of what does the subject commit the underlying identity mistake on the basis of which two webs are created for one thing? If webs are guises, it is not open to an advocate of webs to respond: in virtue of different webs/guises. But then it is not so easy to see how differences in webs alone could explain/ground differences in cognitive values. Instead, pending further developments, it would rather seem that it is not webs themselves, but the incorrect identifications on which they can be based, that generate and explain cognitive value in its full generality.

Aside from these qualms, I think that the book is more than worth reading by interested researchers, as it provides a very clear overview of current debates in the philosophy of language and offers the sketch of an original version of the still plausible claim (ii), according to which direct reference is compatible with a descriptivist account of cognitive value.


Evans, G. (1982). The Varieties of Reference. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Perry, J. (1979). "The Problem of the Essential Indexical." Noûs 13 (Dec.): 3-21.

Recanati, F. (2012). Mental Files. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Salmon, N. (1990). "A Millian Heir Rejects the Wages of Sinn." In C. A. Anderson & J. Owens (eds), Propositional Attitudes: The Role of Content in Logic, Language, and Mind. Stanford: CSLI Publications, 215-247.

Soames, S. (2002). Beyond Rigidity: The Unfinished Semantic Agenda of Naming and Necessity. Oxford: Oxford University Press.