Philosophy of Language: Key Thinkers

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Barry Lee (ed.), Philosophy of Language: Key Thinkers, Continuum, 2011, 301pp., $29.95(pbk), ISBN 9781441100153.

Reviewed by Ori Simchen, University of British Columbia


The philosophy of language is a more or less steady flow of difficult but rewarding ideas emanating from the great logical writings of Frege and Russell of the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries. The field has a rather complex history. One of its mid-century tributaries was the Ordinary Language School in and around Oxford (including Cambridge, MA); another was Wittgenstein and his followers in and around Cambridge (including Ithaca, NY); yet a third was the forced displacement of Carnap, Reichenbach, and Tarski out of central Europe and their North American immersion and association with such mathematical logicians as Quine and Church. Other important developments combined elements from this rich abundance with further extensions and reactions. Such historical complexity, coupled with the predominance of mathematical logic within the field, poses a special pedagogical challenge as to how best to provide novices with a point of entry into it. Several competing options are available, each with its advantages and drawbacks. This book tackles the problem of making the area as a whole accessible to students by devoting each of its chapters to a central figure within this development (the one exception being the final chapter on the work of Derrida -- work that emanates from the writings of Husserl and Heidegger, a different source altogether). This in itself is a helpful idea in light of how difficult beginners tend to find the subject. The approach has the added benefit of dissecting the field into manageable chunks around individual 'Key Thinkers'. Many of us who teach the philosophy of language to undergraduates find it particularly useful to pit major figures against one another, thereby offering students a kind of dynamic representation of progress while guarding against potential impressions of stagnation.

There are, however, two obvious risks associated with such a strategy in its current form. First, individual essays on the ideas of central figures are unlikely, even as a collective, to provide the requisite systematic backdrop for a useful appreciation of the most consequential ideas in the field. The problem is especially acute in this particular area, where an exposure to technical basics is essential for the absorption of some of the main moves.[1] Second, and no less crucial, the opportunity for bias or oversight in selecting the A-list of figures is very much increased by such an approach. The book suffers from both of these faults. This does not diminish from the achievement of some of the individual essays, of course, some of them excellent pieces of scholarship, but it does mar the collection as a whole. On the positive side, however, there is a further risk associated with any such collection of individual essays of making the field it covers appear unduly bifurcated into disparate concerns, but here the editor's introduction manages to weave the individual chapters into a coherent whole.

On the back cover of the book it says: "Crucially the book demonstrates how the ideas and arguments of these key thinkers have contributed to our understanding of the theoretical account of language use and its central concepts." And in the first paragraph of the editor's introductory essay we read the following:

Language use is a largely distinctive feature of human life. Although other animals communicate (in the sense of transmitting information) in something like the way we find in language-use, no other animal we know of has a resource with the expressive power and range found in humans' language-using capacities. (1)

There is quite an emphasis on language-use here, which provides some early indication of tipping the theoretical balance in favor of a use-based orientation (itself traceable to the British engagement with the ideas of the later Wittgenstein). Contrast this with the following opening lines from Frege's late essay 'Compound Thoughts'[2]:

It is astonishing what language can do. With a few syllables it can express an incalculable number of thoughts, so that even a thought grasped by a human being for the very first time can be put into a form of words which will be understood by someone to whom the thought is entirely new. (1)

The book's choice of emphasis may be contrasted with an alternative focus on a more direct descent of ideas from Frege and Russell via Carnap and Tarski to later work in formal semantics either of the model-theoretic variety (Montague) or the truth-theoretic variety (Davidson). The emphasis on a use-based orientation is not inevitable, of course, but it seems perfectly reasonable -- indeed, pedagogically sound -- for the editor to have picked a particular angle rather than attempt to force a kind of methodological egalitarianism which never really works anyway. So it is in light of such an orientation that it can seem surprising that there should be no chapter in the book devoted to the seminal use-theoretic work of P.F. Strawson, especially given the fact that Strawson has been so influential for subsequent work in the field.

Strawson is eminently important for contemporary philosophy of language. Among other major contributions, his work offers a powerful reaction to Russell's celebrated theory of descriptions; but the historical importance of his work far outstrips the challenge it poses to a Russellian analysis of descriptions. Let me digress for a brief illustration of the point and then draw a larger moral for the volume under consideration.

Letting φ and ψ be ordinary humdrum predicates,[3] Russell's theory, in a nutshell, is that

(1) the φ is ψ

is to be analyzed as

(2) for some (for all y (y is φ just in case y=x) and is ψ).

Thus, appearances to the contrary notwithstanding, (1), in light of its analysis (2), turns out not to be about anything in particular. (Perhaps we can say that it is about the entire domain of quantification.) Being at bottom an existentialization of a complex predicate, the meaningfulness of (1) does not depend on any particular object ouniquely φ-ing. Given the analysis of (1) in terms of (2), (1) entails that

(3) for some x (for all y (is φ just in case y=x)),

so that if (3) is false then (1) is false as well.

Strawson's response, also in a nutshell, is to insist that (1) is a subject-predicate sentence just as the tradition and surface syntax would have it. Moreover, (1) is about the particular object o that the descriptive phrase 'the φ' picks out. The meaningfulness of (1) is compatible with the failure of (1) to express a proposition on a particular occasion of use due to there not being anything that uniquely φs. An utterance of (1) does not entailpace Russell, that something uniquely φs, but, rather, presupposes it: if (3) is false then the question whether (1) is true or false 'simply does not arise'.[4] So in such a case the utterance of (1) would fail to express a proposition.

Much of Strawson's reaction to Russell's theory will later be picked up and developed by key contributors to the field. The idea that certain information associated with the use of a descriptive sentence is not logically entailed by it but rather implied by it in some other way has become the cornerstone of the program of working out the mechanics of presupposition in natural language. The idea that the meaningfulness of descriptive sentences is one thing, whereas expressing a truth-evaluable content on a particular occasion of use is another, will later provide a template of sorts for theorists working on the semantics of context-sensitivity. The idea that mundane sentences of English are perfectly capable of expressing singular propositions, propositions that are about particular things and are not merely generalities about the entire domain, has become essential for theorists developing a structured propositions approach to the semantics of natural language, one of the dominant trends in the field today. A chapter on Strawson -- also covering perhaps his reaction to Austin on truth and his efforts (with Grice) to undermine Quine's assault on the analytic-synthetic distinction -- would provide students with a much-needed historical precedent for much that is current in the philosophy of language.

A lot of the development of the aforementioned Strawsonian ideas has been taking place in the US rather than the UK. Given that the book as a whole presents a rather English outlook on the field, it is not surprising that Strawson, who has had an important impact on American philosophy of language, did not make the cut. The impression of a distinctly English outlook is enhanced by the fact that some of the most exciting turns in the philosophy of language on the North American side of the Atlantic are barely touched upon in this volume. Of course one can always quibble over the choice of figures to include, but some exclusions are particularly noteworthy and distorting for those of us intellectually raised and inculcated in North America. Keith Donnellan's œuvre, as influential as it has been for the direct reference program, is never discussed. (The only mention I could find of Donnellan was a reference to his famous 1966 paper 'Reference and Definite Descriptions' under the 'Further Readings' section of Ken Taylor's interesting piece on Russell.) Ideas of Ruth Barcan Marcus regarding names as mere tags have been highly influential as well, and distinct from Kripke's seemingly related ideas about rigidity and Kaplan's seemingly related ideas about direct reference.[5] Marcus is never mentioned in the book. For that matter, the relative neglect of Kaplan's direct reference program is bound to strike a North American reader as strange. In many ways, the ideas of Donnellan, Marcus, and Kaplan command the attention of those who wish to become primed in the subject as it is currently practiced more than the ideas of Davidson and Dummett (who have had a profound influence on the 1970s British philosophy of language scene).

When it comes to editing a collection of essays under the 'Key Thinkers' series certain omissions are inevitable, to be sure. But some omissions are just more regrettable than others. Let me conclude, then, by noting that while this collection of essays may have some utility as a point of entry into this large and exciting field for British undergraduates, its value for their contemporaries elsewhere in the English-speaking world is more limited. This is not to say that the essays, taken severally, are not useful in their own right. I found the essays on Frege, Russell, Grice, and Davidson, to be particularly thought provoking and rich. But the book as a whole does not do justice to some of the most important ideas that have made the philosophy of language such an engaging area of intellectual pursuit.

[1] This is why widely used anthologies, such as A. P. Martinich, The Philosophy of Language, Fifth Edition (Oxford UP, 2008), elect to introduce the subject by offering a crash course in rudimentary formal semantics.

[2] Gottlob Frege, 'Compound Thoughts', Mind 72 (1963), pp. 1-17.

[3] Let us assume, in particular, that ψ is operator-free. Thus, 'not my favorite number', 'possibly my favorite number', and 'assumed to be my favorite number' are all excluded here.

[4] See P.F. Strawson, 'On Referring', Mind 59 (1950), pp. 320-344, at p. 330.

[5] For a brief yet insightful discussion of this last point, see Genoveva Martí, 'On Modality and Reference', Teorema (2012), pp. 203-212.