Philosophy of Language

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Scott Soames, Philosophy of Language, Princeton University Press, 2010, 189pp., $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780691138664.

Reviewed by Zoltán Gendler Szabó, Yale University


"Philosophy of language is, above all else, the midwife of the scientific study of language, and language use." (1) While this might be slightly overstated (which philosopher, besides Sylvain Bromberger, has done anything for the birth of modern phonology?), the claim is undeniable when it comes to the study of linguistic meaning. Following philosophically inclined logicians -- Frege, Russell, and Tarski -- the theoretical framework of modern semantics was built in large part by philosophers -- Davidson, Montague, Kripke, Kaplan, Lewis, and Stalnaker. The foundations were laid in the sixties and seventies and they have changed remarkably little since. Semantics has its results, its journals, its textbooks, and it thrives today within linguistics without much input from philosophers. (Philosophers of language nowadays contribute less than 10% of the papers in the four leading journals of the field.) What is a good midwife to do when the baby is born? She fills out the documents and moves on. This is the agenda of Soames's admirably lucid and concise book: a reconstruction of what philosophers of language have done in the past in semantics and some proposals about what they might do in the future.

The part about the past is exemplary: it would serve better than any text I am familiar with as a companion to the reading of classic papers in upper-level undergraduate and introductory-level graduate classes. This is not a work in the history of philosophy: no attempt is made to stick with obsolete terminology; no time spent exploring paths that have turned out to be dead ends. There are several significant innovations in the presentation of the material. Singular propositions are motivated against Fregean strictures by considerations of quantifying into belief-reports, rather than getting bogged down with the semantics of proper names before that topic could be profitably discussed (19). Generalized quantifiers are introduced early and the assumption that quantification in natural languages is very similar to quantification in the languages of first-order logic is meticulously avoided. This also eliminates the need for burdening Russell's theory of description with his own cumbersome views on incomplete symbols (23). An important distinction is made between the formal results of Tarski's early work and his subsequent philosophical gloss on it, which helps avoid confusion about the relationship between a definition of truth and a theory of meaning (40). There is an outstanding summary of Montague's treatment of quantification in English (65-9), a much neglected topic in philosophy despite its tremendous impact on the development of semantics. The rigidity of natural kind terms (as opposed to natural kind predicates) is illustrated and explained with the care the topic deserves (88- 91). We even get a brief discussion of the difference between Kaplan's two rigidifying devices, dthat and actually (99-100). All this and more written without fuss and clutter.

It is probably inevitable that there are omissions in such a compressed presentation. To this reviewer, two stand out: Strawson's work on presupposition and Davidson's semantics of action sentences remain unmentioned. (Strawson does not make it into the index either; Davidson is there only because of his work on truth and meaning.) Many philosophers today hold that Strawson was completely wrong and that presupposition is a thoroughly pragmatic phenomenon. This seems unlikely: even if presupposition itself is pragmatic, the fact that an expression is a presupposition trigger is almost certainly a matter of its lexical meaning. Moreover, pragmatic explanations given for the basic facts of presupposition projection fail to capture the robustness of the phenomenon. So the omission of Strawson seems unfortunate. Likewise Davidson, whose suggestion that the logical form of action sentences contains existential quantification over underlying events has turned into a thriving research program in the last forty years, yielding satisfying accounts of the semantics of manner adverbs, perception reports, the progressive aspect, plurals, causatives, focus, secondary predication, and much else. Presupposition and eventualities are of considerable foundational significance: the former opens up avenues towards dynamic conceptions of meaning and the latter may hold the key for an alternative to the possible-world analysis of modality. These topics should probably be included in a survey of how philosophy shaped semantics in the last century.

Soames's book is refreshingly free of prevalent philosophical dogma. It is not taken for granted that we can only quantify over what exists (31), that necessary truths are necessarily necessary (55), or that water's being H2O (and vice versa) is necessary aposteriori (93). Montague's idea that proper names and quantified noun phrases belong in the same semantic category receives a sympathetic hearing (67-9), though some of the standard criticisms against the proposal are repeated without considering the best responses available. Soames is of course correct in pointing out that it is implausible that language users would have introduced expressions designating higher-order properties before they had words for ordinary individuals or that pronouns would uniformly designate generalized quantifiers (70). But flexible versions of Montague Grammar have been on offer for more than two decades.[1] In Flexible Montague Grammar proper names and singular pronouns are assigned individuals as semantic values and the higher-order denotations are derived through type-shifting. Type-shifting permits a novel account of quantification dispensing with Montague's cumbersome quantifying-in rules as well as with the syntactically dubious quantifier-raising introduced by some of his early followers. Whether type-shifting provides an adequate theory of quantification for natural languages is an open empirical question, but there isn't much doubt that a theory that employs it bypasses the concern mentioned by Soames.

Minor quibbles aside, Part 1 of the book is a superb survey of the construction of the philosophical scaffolding of modern semantics. Part 2 -- new directions for philosophy of language -- maintains these high philosophical standards, and the intrinsic interest of the subjects it addresses is extremely high. But it lacks the magisterial sweep of the first half. Though the material is provocative and meticulously argued, it is basically a quick survey of the author's own recent work. And as prolegomena for future philosophy of language goes, this one is rather bleak. According to Soames, we can turn to metaphysics (working on the question of what accounts for the representational character of propositions), to epistemology (working on the nature and possibility of the contingent apriori), or to pragmatics (establishing the proper boundary it bears to semantics). The first two of these topics do not specifically concern language; they belong to a general study of intentionality. And given the view Soames advocates (eschewing hidden variables in logical form, embracing non-propositional semantic content for many sentences, postulating pragmatic enrichment driven by general principles of rationality) details of semantics proper have no significant impact on what should be said about the third. The recommendation for the midwife of semantics appears to be: Step aside and concern yourself with something else. This is definitely not my assessment of the situation -- I believe doing semantics can offer important and distinctively philosophical rewards. Getting clear about the way plurals, mass nouns, tense, modality, counterfactuals, generics, attitude reports, etc. are interpreted can help clear up difficulties about the subject matter these expressions are used to talk about.

Soames thinks that sorting out what exactly propositions are makes a real difference to semantics. And in a sense, semanticists should care about this question more than mathematicians should about the nature of numbers or physicists about the individuation of events. Standard textbook semantics advances a substantive reductive claim -- that propositions are sets of possible worlds -- and thus sets itself up for legitimate philosophical criticism. Of course, those who write the standard textbooks are fully aware of the grounds for the criticism: it seems that the sentences 'Hesperus is a planet' and 'Phosphorus is a planet' are true in the same possible worlds but the proposition expressed by one can be accepted by someone who rejects the proposition expressed by the other, and thus those propositions must be distinct. So, if the problem is well-known, why do semanticists go on proposing such a dubious reduction? Some do it for the sake of convenience: even if propositions are not sets of possible worlds, for some theoretical purposes they can be represented as such. But for others, the identification is principled: they think there really are possible worlds where Hesperus is not Phosphorus, and so they are not moved by the standard criticism.

Most philosophers nowadays think this latter view is incoherent -- since Hesperus and Phosphorus are one there is no way for them to be two. But Soames thinks otherwise. He has argued before, and in this book argues again, that among the possible worlds there are metaphysically impossible ones, as long as they cannot be ruled out apriori. This is so because possible worlds are not alternative universes but maximal world-representing properties -- states the world could be in -- and the instantiation of some of these properties is metaphysically impossible. To wit, according to some possibilities Scott Soames is Saul Kripke (55) and according to some Hesperus is not Phosphorus. On the other hand, since Soames regards apriori necessities as true according to all possible worlds, by switching the example he can reinstate the trouble for the identification of propositions with sets of possible worlds: '437 is divisible by 23' and '19 × 23 is divisible by 23' are true according to the same possible worlds even though the proposition expressed by one can be accepted by someone who rejects the proposition expressed by the other. So these propositions cannot be sets of possible worlds.

I am not convinced that Soames's position is stable. If we are willing to acknowledge the existence of a state the world could be in where Hesperus is not Phosphorus, why not admit a state where 19 × 23 is not 437? Why read the could in state the world could be in as could for all that is true apriori rather than, say, could for all that is true self-evidently? For the purposes of semantics, possibilities are the same only if their identity isn't an issue in any inquiry we might wish to conduct, and since apriori investigations are aplenty individuating possible worlds by apriori equivalence is too coarse-grained. One may be concerned that possibilities incompatible with apriori truths are not ideally conceivable and that consequently we couldn't really make sense of them. I myself have a hard time making sense of time-travel or the Tarski-Banach theorem, even though the former is apparently possible and the latter apparently true. And even if ideal conceivability is the guide to some kind of possibility, why think it is guide to the broadest kind?

Soames has a master argument against the claim that propositions are sets of truth-supporting circumstances that is independent of how finely those circumstances are individuated.[2] He alludes to this argument in the book (112) but does not present it in detail. It is a reductio and it goes roughly as follows: (i) The ancients believed that 'Hesperus' refers to Venus and 'Phosphorus' refers to Venus. (ii) But any circumstance where 'Hesperus' refers to Venus and 'Phosphorus' refers to Venus is a circumstance where 'Hesperus' and 'Phosphorus' co-refer. (iii) So, if propositions are sets of truth-supporting circumstances then the ancients believed that 'Hesperus' refers to Venus and 'Phosphorus' refers to Venus and 'Hesperus' and 'Phosphorus' co-refer. (iv) But then the ancients believed that 'Hesperus' and 'Phosphorus' co-refer -- (v) which they obviously did not. The crucial step is taken when we reach (iii). This step assumes that clauses designating the same proposition can be substituted in belief-ascriptions salva veritate. This assumption is usually backed up by another -- that believe expresses the same binary relation between a thinker and a proposition in any context of utterance. Whether this is true strikes me as a wide open question for semantics, not something we can settle on the basis of direct intuitions. In this connection it is useful to remember that the direct intuition that if is a binary operator is no longer universally accepted -- the view that its function is to mark the domain restriction on a sometimes contextually supplied quantifier or modal is viewed as a very serious contender. This is so because the restrictor view has important explanatory advantages that may in the end outweigh its conflict with direct intuitions.

I suspect the nitty-gritty of semantics matters greatly for the other two topics Soames discusses as well. His preferred route to the contingent apriori involves the logician's actually and he expresses skepticism regarding the more usual route through proper names introduced by definite descriptions. But he also concedes that the English actually is not exactly the logician's actually (143). Without advances in semantics we are left in doubt whether the contingent apriori is really expressible in a natural language. Soames criticizes Stanley's binding argument and embraces free enrichment in determining what proposition is asserted by a speaker who utters a sentence like 'Every student answered every question' (167). But unconstrained enrichment could yield not only the proposition that every student in this class answered every question on her exam but also the proposition that every student in this class answered every question on her exam and her favorite question. Arguably, the sentence cannot be used to say such a thing no matter what the speaker's intentions might be. We need semantically motivated constraints on enrichment, and once these are in place we need to revisit the question whether postulating hidden variables in logical form still looks unmotivated. There is no royal road: as semantics grows to maturity it gets a say in how philosophers continue their investigations. Despite the concerns I have expressed above, this outstanding book actually helps explain why.

[1] E.g., Partee, B. (1987) 'Noun phrase interpretation and type-shifting principles.' In J. Groenendijk et al. eds., Studies in Discourse Representation Theory and the Theory of Generalized Quantifiers. GRASS 8. Dordrecht: Foris, 115-43, and Hendriks, H. (1993) Studied Flexibility: Categories and Types in Syntax and Semantics. Amsterdam: University of Amsterdam, ITLI.

[2] 'Direct Reference, Propositional Attitudes, and Semantic Content' (1987) Philosophical Topics 15: 44-87.