Philosophy of Law

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Andrei Marmor, Philosophy of Law, Princeton University Press, 2011, 172pp., $22.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691141671.

Reviewed by Dennis Patterson, European University Institute, Florence/Rutgers University/Swansea University


This book is one of the first volumes in a new series by Princeton University Press, Princeton Foundations of Contemporary Philosophy, published under the editorial stewardship of Scott Soames. The book is not an introduction to legal philosophy. Rather it is, as its author describes it, "focused on some of the main issues that have preoccupied philosophy about the nature of law in the last half century or so." (11) Marmor is quite straightforward in remarking that his book "is not meant to be comprehensive" but rather "an argument for a particular position." (11)

Composed of an Introduction and six chapters, Marmor's book is written squarely within the tradition of Anglo-American analytic jurisprudence. He covers many of the usual topics, including authority, validity, interpretation, Hart's positivism, Dworkin's constructivism and a chapter (indeed, the book's first chapter) on the work of Hans Kelsen, who, in the world of Anglo-American general jurisprudence, has not received nearly as much attention as other theorists.[1]

Marmor is not interested in giving a comprehensive overview of any given topic; rather, he gives you his own point of view. Naturally, in the course of doing so, he takes on the views of others, either mentioning them or directly engaging them. He is a capable philosopher even when he is talking about non-legal topics. This makes for a lively book. However, there are places where Marmor could have engaged criticisms of the views he endorses. Despite these disappointments, the book is worth close attention.

In the "Introduction," Marmor provides a nice overview of one of the main issues in contemporary analytic legal theory, that of the "nature of law." He opens with a story about the introduction of a new law in California requiring drivers using mobile phones to do so only in "hands free" fashion. The road sign "Hands Free Phone, July 1st, It's The Law!" conveys both descriptive and prescriptive content. The descriptive part is what the California legislature did in Sacramento. The latter part alerts us to law's essentially prescriptive character: it purports to give us reasons for action (in virtue of the fact that the legislature has acted in a certain way).

From the descriptive and the prescriptive, Marmor moves to the distinction between legal validity and legal normativity. As "every lawyer knows," what makes the California mobile phone statute valid is that the law was created in the right way by the right group of people (i.e., the California legislature). But this is not what interests philosophers, for they are concerned with "the conditions that constitute the idea of legal validity." (3) Are these conditions just social facts (e.g., what the legislature has done), or is there more to validity? For example, do substantive normative considerations play a role in determining legal validity?

On this question, Marmor counts three schools of thought, representing three approaches to legal validity and the nature of law. Legal positivists conceive of law as a matter of social facts coupled with people's actions, beliefs and attitudes: a putative law is valid if the legislature acted in a certain way at a certain time. The Natural Law tradition denies that law is simply a matter of social facts. Putative legal norms may be, indeed must be, evaluated for their normative content. Finally, there is the view that while "moral content is not a necessary condition of legality, it may be a sufficient one." (5) This last position is represented by Ronald Dworkin as well as by so-called inclusive or "soft" positivism.

Marmor explains, correctly, that there are important variant views in each of the three described traditions. He identifies as a recurrent theme "the possibility of detaching the conditions that constitute legal validity from the evaluative content of the putative norms in question." (5) Legal positivists claim that "the conditions of validity are divorced from content" (5) while Dworkinians, for example, claim that "what the law is partly depends on what the law ought to be in some relevant sense of ought." (5) Law's "essential normative character," (5) Marmor claims, is not in dispute: law purports to provide reasons for action. "The doubts concern the question of what kind of reasons legal norms provide." (5)

Debates about the conditions of legal validity lead to a more general debate, one about the nature of the enterprise of philosophy of law itself. Is jurisprudence purely descriptive or is normative theorizing an essential feature of the discipline? The methodological questions[2] have become central points of debate in the field, leading to two main themes: the relations between the factual and the normative and between substance and method. (7) The possibility of "detachment"[3] is identified as an important theme in general jurisprudence, one that Marmor identifies as central to this book. Finally, he states the additional goal of trying "to show that a substantial part of these debates centers on the question of the possibility of reduction." (7-8)

Marmor is quite explicit in his focus. He says: "This book is focused on the philosophical controversies that concern the general nature of law." (10) Consistent with many scholars who take up the difficult and central question of the "nature of law," Marmor describes this undertaking as one that seeks to identify the essential features of law and the essentially authoritative nature of law. Regrettably, Marmor writes as if no one has put in question the enterprise of conceptual analysis from which such investigations proceed. It is disappointing to read Marmor's views on the debates about the nature of law as if the critiques of Wittgenstein and Quine of "necessity" and the "essential" have no role to play in the enterprise of legal philosophy. Marmor is well aware of the debates over the efficacy of conceptual analysis, in legal philosophy and elsewhere. Yet no mention is made of this work.[4] This is a disappointing omission from an otherwise rewarding book.[5]

By contrast, Marmor's defense of legal positivism is vigorous and creative. He champions the work of Hans Kelsen. In fact, he goes so far as to say that while Hart barely mentions Kelsen in The Concept of Law, "Hart's theory of law takes Kelsen's foundation to its reasonable conclusions, relying on some of Kelsen's best insights" (35). Kelsen was a strong antireductionist. As Marmor sees it, Kelsen rejected any explanation of law's normativity that reduced law to another domain. Yet, Marmor maintains, that's precisely what Kelsen does in his explanation of the Basic Norm (Grundnorm).

Marmor begins by rejecting the conventional wisdom that Kelsen's argument for the presumed validity of the Basic Norm is transcendental in nature. While Kelsen may have thought that at one time, he abandoned the position in favor of the view that law presents us with a normative picture (much like morality or religion). More important than validity is efficacy, for it is this that grounds the Basic Norm. (22) Characterizing Kelsen's position as "normative relativism," (23) Marmor describes the relationship between the Basic Norm and the norms of a legal system this way:

The norms that are legally valid in any given legal order are those that derive from the basic norm, but the content of the basic norm is fully determined by social practice. Therefore, the conditions that determine the legal validity of norms turn out, on Kelsen's own account, to consist in facts about people's actions, beliefs and attitudes -- facts that constitute what the basic norm of any given legal system is. (25)

This sounds as if Kelsen believed that the basic choice of perspective or vantage point is arbitrary. Thus, what makes legal normativity unique "is the uniqueness of its point of view -- the legal point of view." (27) If this were all there is to Kelsen's view, it seems appropriate to characterize his perspective as "reductive," for it reduces legal validity to social facts. (28) Marmor resists this both as the best reading of Kelsen and as a substantive conclusion about the nature of law. The challenge, as he puts it, "is how to reconcile an explanation of legal validity, which is, most plausibly, a reductive one, with an explication of legal normativity, which must be given in terms of valid reasons for action." (28)

Rescuing Kelsen starts with the reminder that "to Kelsen the law is basically a scheme of interpretation." (29) A philosophical account of the nature of law both explains what this scheme consists in as well as being "an account of the collective, public, and, to some extent objective meaning." (29) Law is like language, Marmor advises. Thus, it "makes no more sense to offer a reduction of philosophy of law to sociology as it would make sense to reduce philosophy of language to sociology." (29)

Marmor's revamping of Kelsen's position starts with philosophical naturalism, specifically Brian Leiter's distinction between reductive-displacement and agenda-displacement theories. Following Leiter in his reading of the American Legal Realists, Marmor argues that the realists "were not interested in the philosophy of law." (32) Rather, their interest was in "the kinds of tools we need to be able to determine how judges reach their decisions, and what would enable us to predict the kinds of decisions they are likely to make in the future." (32) In fact, the Realists presupposed a philosophy of law; namely, positivism. It is this conception of the nature of law that is presupposed by sociological jurisprudence. As Marmor states it: "Kelsen would have agreed that such a methodological displacement theory actually presupposes that there is some philosophical account available to explain how legal sources differ from other types of constraints on decisions of judges and legal officials." (33) So, naturalized jurisprudence is "not really jurisprudence" because it is not concerned with the nature of law. The philosophical question about the nature of law is "one about a scheme of interpretation: it is a question about the collective meaning and self-understandings of a complex social reality." (33)

In evaluating Marmor's reworking of Kelsen's position, it is important to remember the problem to which his work is directed. Marmor is at pains to show that Kelsen's view of the nature of law is ultimately not reductive. Kelsen is not reducing one kind of theory to another. (29) Law cannot be reduced to sociology. Marmor insists that on his reading of Kelsen, "the nature of law is an account of the collective, public, and, to some extent objective, meaning of some social reality." (29) To bolster his position, Marmor turns to the American Legal Realists. Marmor seems to think that because the American Legal Realists presupposed a positivist view of law, this entails that Kelsen's anti-reductionism succeeds. But does it?

The core idea of legal positivism is that "a human posit: some normative command … is a law (or legally valid…) because of actions taken by human beings."[6] Hart's master rule, the Rule of Recognition, is a convergent practice of officials. It is in virtue of the beliefs and attitudes of officials that the criteria of legal validity exist. As Leiter reminds us, there is "massive and pervasive agreement about the law throughout the system."[7] At bottom, it is the convergence of behavior and attitude that explains the fact that only a very small percentage of cases is disputed. Leiter emphasizes:

Legal professionals agree about what the law requires so often because, in a functioning legal system, what the law is is fixed by a discernible practice of officials who decide questions of legal validity by reference to criteria of legal validity on which they recognizably converge.[8]

As Leiter reads the American Legal Realists, law is a matter of belief and attitude.[9] The vast majority of legal questions are answered by convergence and agreement in the criteria for valid law. For a small group of disputed cases, the true grounds of decision lie elsewhere. Of course, the Realists were "not interested in providing a competing … conceptual thesis about the nature of law." (33) The Realists had no interest in a conceptual thesis about the nature of law: in their view, it is in the beliefs and attitudes of officials that one finds the explanatory basis of law.

I mentioned earlier Marmor's claim that Hart was strongly influenced by Kelsen. According to Marmor, "Hart generally accepted Kelsen's theory of the basic norm, while explicitly rejecting its antireductionist underpinning." (51) Whereas Kelsen simply presupposed the Basic Norm, Hart reduces the Rule of Recognition to a social rule. (50) Marmor is anxious to show that Hart's account of the social character of the Rule of Recognition is "reductionist" in ways that Kelsen is not. He states: "Hart's idea of the rule of recognition is essentially the idea of Kelsen's basic norm characterized reductively in terms of social facts that prevail in a given community. The relevant social facts … are facts about people's conduct, beliefs, and attitudes." (51)

Marmor is correct, of course, that Hart motivates his account of the Rule of Recognition with his practice theory of rules. According to Marmor, what Hart needs "is a detailed account of what social rules are, and how social rules ground both the ideas of legal validity and the normativity we ascribe to law." (51) Marmor wants Hart to explain "the reasons people might have for following rules; Hart's account seems to be silent on the question of what makes it rational or intelligible for people to regard the relevant social norms as binding or obligatory." (57) An answer to these questions would provide us with an answer to "the question about the normativity of law that we have sought all along: the question of how to explain this obligatory or binding element of legal norms." (57)

The question whether Hart needs a theory for the binding character of legal rules has been the subject of vigorous debate. Marmor makes no mention of this, writing as if it is somehow self-evident that Hart needs to ground the Rule of Recognition. In the closing pages of his chapter on Hart, he mentions Joseph Raz's claims regarding the "essential" aspect of law, that being its claim to be a legitimate authority. What is missing from Marmor's account of Hart is any mention of the view that Hart simply does not need to provide a normative grounding for the Rule of Recognition.

In a widely-discussed article, Julie Dickson showed convincingly that the Rule of Recognition does not need to be reason-giving. She took up Marmor's argument directly:

the crucial question in all of this is whether the practice in common amongst judges of recognizing certain things as valid law is reason-giving. In examining Hart's and Marmor's views, I have sought to make clear a distinction which, in my view, is sometimes under-attended to in discussions of the rule of recognition, namely the distinction between common judicial practice as an existence condition of that rule, and as playing an identifying role with regard to it on the one hand, and that practice playing a reason-giving role with regard to it on the other … .In explaining the character of the rule of recognition, including the role of common judicial practice with regard to that rule, Hart was undertaking the explanatory task of giving an account of some of law's essential properties. He was not attempting to justify or explain what is valuable about the social institution of law, and he was not attempting to give an account of the reasons why and the conditions under which the rules of a legal system including the rule of recognition ought to be accepted and adhered to.[10]

Marmor mentions none of this, nowhere citing Dickson's article. It is simply not uncontroversial that Hart needs a defense of the "normativity" or the binding character of legal norms. Is such a defense "essential," as Marmor claims? Let us consider his argument.

Raz's service conception of authority is well-known: law necessarily claims legitimate authority, which according to Raz entails that law necessarily claims to serve those subject to it by giving them a better chance of conforming with the independent normative reasons that apply to them if they conform to the law than if they attempt to act on their own judgment of what reasons apply to them. Marmor thinks Raz's account of authority provides the missing element in Hart's account of the nature of law. This is why Marmor thinks Raz is so important: "Raz's thesis about the essentially authoritative nature of law gives us the basic structure of the kinds of reasons we may have for regarding the law as binding." (71)[11] Obviously, Raz makes strong conceptual claims. He writes: "A theory consists of necessary truths, for only necessary truths about the law reveal the nature of law."[12] This view is not without its difficulties.

Marmor writes as if conceptual analysis is an uncontroversial philosophical methodology. It is not. Kenneth Himma and Brian Leiter have both written strong critiques of claims to conceptual necessity by Raz (Himma) as well as the implausibility of conceptual analysis as a philosophical methodology (Leiter). Marmor mentions none of this work. As I noted earlier in the discussion of the Introduction and Marmor's discussion of the nature of law, claims about the nature of law and appeals to conceptually necessary features of law require some defense. It is not enough merely to assert that law has this or that conceptually "necessary" feature.

There are three reasons why unreflective recourse to claims of "necessity" is problematic. The first is Quine's critique of the analytic/synthetic distinction. The second is the work in so-called "experimental philosophy" which demonstrates widespread divergence in linguistic intuitions.[13] Finally, there is the catalog of monumental failures of conceptual analysis.[14] All manner of conceptual claims once thought to be obviously true were subsequently shown to be false.

Marmor's final three chapters examine Dworkin's thesis that law is an interpretive enterprise, the morally neutral character of legal positivism, and the proper role of interpretation in law. Marmor's critique of Dworkin is clear and concise. Dworkin's central claim, "that every conclusion about the content of law is a result of interpretation" (99) is subjected to withering criticism.[15] Marmor does not deny that law requires interpretation. He embraces the commonsense view that "the content of law is often clear enough." (144) When legal norms conflict, semantic indeterminacy arises, or pragmatic considerations present themselves, interpretation is in order -- but only then. Marmor's final chapter is an excellent account of the proper scope and application of interpretation in law.

In the course of this review, I have been critical of certain aspects of Marmor's treatment of some key issues in contemporary analytic legal theory. A skilled philosopher, Marmor is well aware of the methodological challenges facing contemporary analytic legal theorists. I would like to know what he thinks of these challenges. As Marmor says himself, the book is "not written as a report but as an argument for a particular position." (11) That position, legal positivism, remains the best account of law on offer.[16]

[1] As is well-known, Stanley Paulson has championed the work of Kelsen. Michael Steven Green has also argued for the importance of Kelsen's thought. Joseph Raz's early work bears the influence of Kelsen. But, by and large, Kelsen is not a prominent figure in debates in Anglo-American analytic jurisprudence.

[2] See John Oberdiek and Dennis Patterson, "Moral Evaluation and Conceptual Analysis in Jurisprudential Methodology", in Legal Philosophy, ed. Michael Freeman and Ross Harrison (New York: Oxford University Press, 2007).

[3] Marmor explains detachment as "the possibility of detaching the conditions that constitute legal validity from the evaluative content of the putative norms in question." (5)

[4] One need not commit oneself to the view that these attacks on 'conceptual necessity' are sound. But they are certainly so widespread in the philosophical literature and persuasive to so many that I believe Marmor should have at least tried to rebut them.

[5] Again, this book is not an introduction. In a series called "Foundations of Contemporary Philosophy," we might expect someone who has distinguished himself for bringing philosophy of language to bear on legal philosophy to have explored Wittgenstein and Quine.

[6] Brian Leiter, "The Radicalism of Legal Positivism". Guild Practitioner, 2010; U of Chicago, Public Law Working Paper No. 303.

[7] Brian Leiter, "Explaining Theoretical Disagreement" (August 3, 2007). U of Texas Law, Public Law Research Paper No. 124.

[8] Leiter, "Explaining Theoretical Disagreement." Marmor's account of American Legal Realism is at odds with Leiter's reading. Leiter explicitly rejects the view that the American Legal Realists were committed to global indeterminacy in law. Quite the opposite! Marmor's reading seems to be far from this view. Consider:

As the realists were at pains to show, judicial decisions are often reached on the basis of judges' instinctive reactions to the facts of the cases they face, using the legal material as a rationalization of their decisions rather than grounds of it… .

To suggest, as the realists have tirelessly argued, that legal norms do not provide sufficient constraints on judicial decisions, entails a necessary, albeit implicit, recognition that some account of what legal norms are, and how they differ from other possible constraints on deliberation, must be available. (33)

The American Legal Realists believed that in appellate judicial decisions, the law is usually indeterminate. Thus, Marmor is incorrect (precisely, the claim is too broad) when he attributes this claim to the Realists: "Legal norms do not provide sufficiently determinate grounds for prediction of what the courts will in fact do." (32)

[9] Leiter believes the Realists are tacit positivists about the nature of law. He further believes that positivism, at least Hart's version, grounds law at bottom in social and psychological facts about officials. The Realists are mainly interested in adjudication, and here they think psychology and sociology are key to explaining decision-making in appellate cases.

[10] Julie Dickson, "Is the Rule of Recognition Really a Conventional Rule?," Oxford Journal of Legal Studies 27 (Autumn 2007): 398.

[11] Of course, even assuming the truth of this claim, it still does not explain why Hart has to provide a normative foundation for the Rule of Recognition.

[12] Joseph Raz, "Can There be a Theory of Law?" in Blackwell Guide to Philosophy and Legal Theory, ed. Martin Golding and William Edmundson (Blackwell: Oxford University Press, 2004), 328.

[13] This work demonstrates the problematic character of Raz's claim that his account of authority explicates "our" conception of law.

[14] Gilbert Harman makes the case:

When problems were raised about particular conceptual claims, they were problems about the examples that had been offered as seemingly clear cases of a priori truth -- the principles of Euclidean geometry, the law of excluded middle, 'Cats are animals', 'Unmarried adult male humans are bachelors', 'Women are female', and 'Red is a colour'. Physics leads to the rejection of Euclidean geometry and at least considers rejecting the law of excluded middle (Quine). We can imagine discovering that cats are not animals but are radio controlled robots from Mars (Putnam). Speakers do not consider the Pope a bachelor (Winograd and Flores). People will not apply the term 'bachelor' to a man who lives with the same woman over a long enough period of time even if they are not married. Society pages in newspapers will identify as eligible 'bachelors' men who are in the process of being divorced but are still married. The Olympic Committee may have rejected certain women as sufficiently female on the basis of their chromosomes. (Robert Schwartz pointed this out to me many years ago.) Just as a certain flavour is really detected by smell rather than taste, we can imagine that the colour red might be detected aurally rather than by sight.

Gilbert Harman, 1999. "Doubts about Conceptual Analysis," in Reasoning, Meaning and Mind (Oxford; New York: Oxford University Press, 1999), 140; specific citations omitted.

[15] An earlier critique of Dworkin's claims for the centrality of interpretation is found in Dennis Patterson, Law and Truth (Oxford; New York: Oxford University Press, 1996).

[16] For comments on drafts of this review, my thanks to Kimberly Kessler Ferzan, Brian Leiter, Hans Oberdiek, John Oberdiek, and Jefferson White. I thank my research assistant, Anna Södersten, for her assistance with the review.