Philosophy of Mathematics: Selected Writings

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Charles S. Peirce, Philosophy of Mathematics: Selected Writings, Matthew E. Moore (ed.), Indiana University Press, 2010, 290 pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780253222657.

Reviewed by Joseph W. Dauben, The Graduate Center, City University of New York


This is an edited collection of mathematical works by the American philosopher and founder of pragmatism, Charles S. Peirce. It is not exhaustive, but focuses on the major writings Peirce produced that are of greatest significance for a correct appreciation of his larger philosophical agenda. The important contribution Moore makes is a careful analysis of the mathematical details within the context of Peirce's overall philosophical development. He is particularly well-suited to do this, being familiar with both the mathematical and philosophical aspects of Peirce's thought.

Moore has worked at both of the two major repositories for Peirce studies, the Peirce papers at Harvard University and the Peirce Edition Project at Indiana University. After explaining the project he has undertaken with a lengthy introduction, he then lets Peirce speak for himself through the papers selected for this volume. Equally valuable are the introductory commentaries on each of the pieces, along with explanatory notes where necessary.

This book has been carefully constructed, as the author explains, to produce a selection of major texts by Peirce to serve as a basic introduction to his philosophy of mathematics, "sufficient in itself for those whose primary interests lie elsewhere, and a stepping-stone for specialists to more advanced investigation." Moore has in fact done an excellent job of bringing the most significant of Peirce's writings on mathematics into focus, as well as linking them to the larger project of Peirce's pragmatic philosophy, both of which were in constant states of revision throughout Peirce's life, and neither of which was ever satisfactorily completed. This has required, as Moore admits, "a good deal of reconstruction and some new construction as well." He is realistic enough to know that he cannot finish what Peirce was unable to complete himself, but I believe Moore has provided an excellent blueprint from which scholars with an interest in Peirce can work with the material provided here to help advance Peirce studies, especially in those areas where mathematics is an essential component for understanding what Peirce sought to accomplish.

There are three main resources for Pierce scholars that are directly related to the selection of Peirce's writings Moore has produced. The earliest is The Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, edited by Charles Hartshorne and Paul Weiss (Harvard University Press, 1931-1958). Unfortunately, due to problems with the editing that greatly distorted those sections of the Collected Papers that deal with mathematics, this is not a reliable resource for any serious scholarship on Peirce and his mathematics (see the extensive detailed critique of this edition in Joseph W. Dauben, "Peirce and History of Science," in Peirce and Contemporary Thought: Philosophical Inquiries, K.L. Ketner, ed. New York: Fordham University Press, 1995: 146-195).

The shortcomings of the Collected Papers were corrected to some extent by Carolyn Eisele in The New Elements of Mathematics (The Hague: Mouton, 1976), but the five books that constitute The New Elements do not provide much in the way of commentary and there are considerable problems with dating the material that Peirce often rewrote and reworked without making clear exactly to what period certain manuscripts belonged. This is slowly being remedied by the Peirce Edition Project based at Indiana University-Purdue University Indianapolis (IUPUI) and currently being published by the Indiana University Press. This is meant to produce a critically edited, chronological series of Peirce's works, but the volumes that have appeared to date do not cover the most important and active periods of Peirce's mathematical creativity. As Moore notes regarding the chronological edition, "its very comprehensiveness will make it difficult for those with a particular interest in the philosophy of mathematics to find their way to what they really need."

Given the problems associated with each of the editions mentioned above, Moore has done an exemplary job of selecting a representative sampling of the most important of Peirce's mathematical works. The special value of his edition is that it is divided into sections to which a reader can easily turn to find what Peirce wrote about "The Nature of Mathematics," "On the Logic of Quantity," "Dichotomic Mathematics," "Pragmatism and Mathematics," "The Ontology of Collections," "Continuity," "On Multitudes," and "Infinitesimals," to name just a few of the twenty-eight selections. Together they cover a broad range of subjects that serves to reflect both Peirce's understanding of mathematics as well as the role it played in his philosophical thinking generally.

Moore's preface, in the compass of thirty-four pages, sets out clearly and succinctly the main objectives of this edition and of Peirce's mathematics in relation to his philosophy. This last point is worth stressing because what Moore has produced is a work that should be of special value to philosophers of mathematics. In the course of his lifetime, Peirce covered a broad spectrum of subjects of current philosophical relevance, and for contemporary philosophers concerned with the sorts of questions with which he dealt, but who may not have had any previous interest in Peirce specifically, this volume will be particularly helpful. For such readers, to whom it is clear Moore intends to make Peirce's thought more easily and transparently available, his detailed introduction and notes throughout the text will be especially welcome.