Philosophy of Mathematics

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Øystein Linnebo, Philosophy of Mathematics, Princeton University Press, 2017, 203 pp., $29.95, ISBN 9781400885244.

Reviewed by Fraser MacBride, University of Manchester


This is an introductory textbook in the philosophy of mathematics. It is intended for advanced undergraduates and graduate students in philosophy as well as mathematicians and others interested in the foundations of mathematics. Is it a good book? Well that all depends upon what standards you apply. I'll return to this (far from trivial) issue shortly. But before I do, you'll need to have a sense of what's between the covers.

The book has twelve chapters, varying between nine and seventeen pages in length; there are four pages of concluding remarks. (The book has wide margins so the pages are relatively short). The first chapter sets the agenda for the rest, laying out "the philosophical challenge" which mathematics has posed for us "ever since the beginning of Western philosophy" (4), the challenge of explaining how we can be reliable indicators of mathematical truths if they're necessary, a priori and their subject matter is abstract; the challenge and the space of potential solutions to the challenge are framed in terms which Linnebo ascribes to Plato and Kant. The next seven chapters cover topics which, Linnebo judges, "tend to be included in any good course in the philosophy of mathematics" (3). Chapter two is devoted to assessing Frege's logicism, whilst chapter three deals with formalism and deductivism, as distinguished from Hilbert's Programme, which is the the topic of chapter four. Chapter five discusses intuitionism, chapter six Mill and Quine's respective empiricist approaches to mathematics, and chapter seven is concerned with nominalism, in particular Field's programme. The remaining five chapters are intended by the author to be "more specialised and somewhat more demanding, both mathematically and philosophically" (3). Chapter eight discusses mathematical intuition as a putative source of evidence for mathematical truth, touching, inter alia, upon the views of Gödel and Maddy. Chapter nine ("Abstraction Reconsidered") is about attempts to revive a recognisable version of Frege's logicism after the Contradiction, including versions advanced by Hale and Wright, as well as Linnebo himself. Chapter ten deals with the iterative conception of set, chapter eleven discusses structuralism in its various eliminative, non-eliminative, and modal guises and chapter twelve the quest for new axioms, i.e. the kind of evidence we can have for adding new axioms to mathematics. The book's concluding remarks provide a summary of the key lessons learnt.

Back to the question: is it a good book? Obviously, a good introductory book shouldn't be judged by the same standards as a good monograph; they're meant to do different things. Whereas we expect an exemplar of the latter kind to push forward the frontiers of the discipline, we expect an exemplar of the former to fulfil its telos by helping draw a new generation of students into the philosophical conversation, enabling them to enter into dialogue with us. We don't mind if the arguments of such a book are sketchy or a little simplified, so long as they provide novices with the inspiration or the intellectual leg-up that facilitates their having their say in the to and fro, because that's the end result that matters for an introductory book. This means the standards for text books in philosophy should be high, in the relevant sense, because when they're good they play an important role in our passing on the torch, enabling others to think for themselves and have the confidence to develop their own views. This is especially so given that Philosophy as a discipline fails to be socially inclusive, the fact that so relatively few of us are women, minority ethnic, working class, disabled and so on. We need to find ways of enabling more of the socially excluded. You might reply: you can't expect Linnebo to tackle social inclusion, or rather the lack of it, in a textbook on the philosophy of mathematics! That's too big an ask. But each time a student from a minority group is inspired and understands more, so she/he feels more confident to engage in the philosophical conversation, it's a small victory for social inclusion. So good introductory books can make a difference because enough small victories add up.

How then does Linnebo's book fare by this standard: how likely is it that it will succeed in helping enable students that don't already have a grasp of the topics it covers to understand and develop facility with the ideas and arguments addressed in the book? In particular, how likely is it that this book will help enable students that aren't already confident about their ability to come to such a happy state? On the one hand, Linnebo maps out a lot of territory in clear and succinct prose. Whilst Linnebo has his own distinctive views and does not seek to hide them, many of the points he makes reflect, if not the consensus understanding, at least a way of understanding the issues commonly to be found in the literature. So students that have the confidence to feel they understand and can run with an idea even when it's only explained cursorily to them are going to learn a lot about the lie of the land in contemporary philosophy of mathematics from reading this book. Of course there will be some students that satisfy this description. This book will be good for them, especially some of the later chapters that touch on subjects that are rarely treated in an introductory guise. That's a good enough thing, enough to make an introductory book worthwhile, because we shouldn't expect a one-size-fits-all rule for introductory books -- because students vary, as lecturers and instructors vary too. But, on the other hand, I think there will be many students that don't feel able to take on ideas that are explained so cursorily because they won't already be confident enough about the subject matter to take on board what Linnebo is saying -- clearly and succinctly perhaps to us but, I suspect, all too briefly to them. For them, the ones that it's so important for us to enable, this book is more of a map than a guidebook, because it covers so much territory. And the problem with a map is that it presupposes an independent ability to navigate by it.

Let me provide some examples of what I mean. Consider chapter nine, "Abstraction Reconsidered". It's only twelve pages long but covers the simple theory of types, neo-fregean abstractionism and Linnebo's own preferred "dynamic abstraction" approach. Inevitably this means the pace is very brisk. Take the discussion of the Caesar problem. Background: Hume's Principle (HP) says that the number of Fs is identical to the number of Gs iff the Fs and the Gs can be put in one-one correspondence: #xFx = #xGx ↔ F G. Linnebo devotes the following three sentences to articulating the problem:

While (HP) gives us a handle on all identity statements of the form '#xFx = #xGx ↔ F G', the principle is silent on mixed identity statements such as '#xFx = Julius Caesar'. Perhaps we know that all such statements are false; but if so that is no thanks to (HP). This is known as the Caesar problem. (133)

Of course, for those of us that are already familiar with the problem this constitutes an effective statement of it. But if you're not already familiar with it, I suspect this is likely to flash by all too quickly. From experience teaching the Caesar problem, students typically ask: What's a "mixed identity statement"? Do I know that all such statements are false? What has this got to do with Julius Caesar? Why does any of this matter anyway? Students aren't going to be able to answer these questions on the basis of the three sentences provided here.

I have similar reservations about the only proposed solution that Linnebo considers to the Caesar problem, presented in just the four following sentences:

Hale and Wright propose a solution based on a simple but powerful idea. When we learn that a criterion of identity applies to an object, we learn something about an object, namely that it has a certain property. So when a criterion of identity applies to one object but not to another, the former object has a property that the other lacks. It follows by Leibniz's Law that the objects are distinct. While the details obviously need to be spelled out, this is a promising beginning. (133)

Again, I think this will be too brisk for many students. For example, Linnebo doesn't explain why he thinks this is "a promising beginning". Nor does he explain why he thinks this should help settle the kind of mixed identity statements mentioned in the preceding excerpt. This proposed solution to the Caesar problem is inherently questionable anyway, at least as Linnebo presents it. Appealing to criteria of identity is meant to solve the Caesar problem, but the proposed solution makes appeal to criteria of identity redundant. If we are to know that a given criterion C applies to x but not to y, we must already be in a position to ascertain both (i) that there is something about x, suppose this to be some feature J, in virtue of which C applies to x, and (ii) that there is no corresponding feature of y, and that's why C doesn't apply to it. Now grant for the sake of argument that we can learn something else about x in virtue of the fact that it satisfies C, namely that it is K as well as J, because whatever satisfies C is also K. But we only learn this new thing about x in a context where we have already distinguished x from y, by the fact that x is J but y isn't. So, the appeal to identity criteria isn't actually playing a role distinguishing x from y; we settle their numerical difference before C comes into play.

There's an even more serious objection to be made. I don't think this is a promising solution because it's question begging and reflects a failure to grasp the nature of the Caesar problem itself. The Caesar problem arises because (HP) settles so little about the nature of numbers, leaves so much open; (HP) tells us what it is for two things identified as numbers (as #xFx and #xGx) to be the same or different (F G or not) but is silent about what it takes for a thing to be a number that isn't already identified as such. So, we cannot logically wring from it that even (e.g.) a man like Caesar isn't a number. As a result we're not even in a position to settle whether (HP) conceived as a criterion of identity applies to Caesar or not. At any rate I was baffled, and I suspect students will be baffled, by the idea that Hale and Wright can so easily dispense with the Caesar problem, because then it's unclear why the Caesar problem should have been worth taking seriously in the first place.

Hale and Wright hold that (HP) is capable of serving as an a priori foundation for mathematics, an abstraction principle which introduces us to numbers. They face what is often called the "Bad Company" objection, although surprisingly this label isn't used in this book. It's the objection, roughly speaking, that (HP) shares its logical form with other abstraction principles that are demonstrably bad in one respect or other (such as Frege's Axiom V which purports to introduce extensions as logical objects but leads to outright contradiction) so we need an account of what makes (HP) good (if it is) and distinguishes it from other bad principles of a similar form. After briefly outlining this demarcation problem for Hale and Wright's approach, Linnebo devotes the final section of chapter nine to his own "Dynamic Abstraction" approach, which is meant to help us leap free from the Bad Company objection. The radical thought here is that the bad abstraction principles aren't bad after all, not so long as we avoid the assumption that they involve quantification over a fixed domain of objects that already includes the extensions etc. introduced by them. Instead, Linnebo argues, we can avoid the prima facie badness of the bad principles by conceiving of an abstraction principle as resulting in "'new' objects that lie outside of the 'old' domain with which we began" (136). Dummett famously argued that we cannot quantify over all the objects falling under certain concepts, such as number or extension (what he called indefinitely extensible concepts) on pain of contradiction, as the paradoxes have taught us (see, for example, Dummett's Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics, Duckworth, 1991, p. 316). If we can form a definite conception of a totality of objects falling under an indefinitely extensible concept, then by reference to that totality we can characterize an even more encompassing totality of them but never a definite totality of all of the objects falling under the aforementioned concept. It seems clear that there are significant connections between Linnebo's dynamic abstraction approach and what Dummett says about indefinite extensibility. But indefinite extensibility isn't discussed in this book. This seems a serious omission.

Here is another example of my general pedagogical theme. In chapter eleven, which discusses a variety of different forms of structuralism, Linnebo devotes one section to an examination of non-eliminative structuralism, the doctrine which Linnebo describes in terms of taking abstract structure talk ontologically seriously, i.e. conceiving abstract structures as if they were objects in their own right. Actually, I think it is questionable to describe non-eliminative structuralism tout court in such terms; for example, Michael Resnik cautions us against automatically taking the step from conceiving certain kinds of object as positions in patterns to conceiving patterns themselves as objects (see his Mathematics as a Science of Patterns, Clarendon, 1997, pp. 246-7). But put that point aside. Linnebo goes on to maintain that it is a distinctive feature of non-eliminative structuralism that mathematical objects from the same structure have a special kind of "ontological dependency" upon each other and the structure to which they belong. Linnebo doesn't explain the relevant notion of ontological dependency he has in mind. In fact, when he comes to explain the relationship between a given mathematical object and the structure to which it belongs he does so in terms of essence rather than ontological dependence, the latter notion then cashed out by him in terms of existence and necessity:

According to this dependence claim, as I shall call it, the essence of a natural number lies in its relations to other natural numbers. As a mere position in this structure, it would not exist without that structure, nor could the structure exist without its other positions. (164)

Linnebo characterizes this as "an attractive explication of the non-eliminative structuralist view that mathematical objects are mere positions in patterns" (164). But he doesn't explain what makes this "attractive" qua explication, nor indeed what it means to provide an "explication" in the present context. So the reader is left adrift, especially because "explication" is often used in a more demanding technical sense in the philosophy of mathematics.

Certainly, Linnebo's description of non-eliminative structuralism uses the very terms and ideas that Stewart Shapiro, a leading non-eliminative structuralist, used to express the doctrine that mathematical objects are mere positions in patterns (Thinking About Mathematics, OUP, 2000, p. 258, quoted by Linnebo). But because they're so close, Linnebo's characterization of Shapiro's views can hardly serve as an "explication" of them in anything but the loosest of senses. The more interesting issue is whether a philosophical theory couched in terms of ontological dependence can constitute an attractive explication of a mathematical theory in the more demanding sense often found in the philosophy of mathematics. Carnap, drawing upon Frege and Russell, wrote, "an explication replaces the imprecise explicandum by a more precise explicatum" ("Replies and Systematic Exposition" in P. Schilpp (ed.), The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap, Open Court, 1962, p. 935). If that's the standard, then it is hard to see how a theory couched in terms of ontological dependence or essence can be an attractive explication. The problem, as I see it, is that the notions of "ontological dependence" and "essence" are metaphysicians' notions. They're foreign to mathematical practice and far less precise and far harder to define than the notions mathematicians typically employ themselves. So if the goal is to explicate the less precise and the less well-defined in terms of the more precise and the better understood -- or at least something close to that goal -- then mathematics cannot be explicated in terms of the obscure notion of ontological dependence. At the beginning of Philosophy of Mathematics, Linnebo warns his reader against "rational metaphysics, which for centuries professed to deliver insights into the ultimate nature of reality and ourselves, based solely on reason" (4). (I'm assuming that "rational metaphysics", a relatively unusual expression, covers rationalist metaphysics -- the term may confuse students). Linnebo reflects, "in stark contrast to rational metaphysics, mathematics is a paradigm of a solid and successful science" (5). So, I imagine that Linnebo would agree with me that it would be a mistake to explain or explicate mathematics in terms of rational metaphysics. Now the notion of ontological dependence may have its source in Aristotle rather than Leibniz, but Aristotelian metaphysics is shaky and precarious compared to the rock of mathematics too. So, I think it would be no less a mistake to explain or explicate mathematics in terms of notions drawn from Aristotelian metaphysics, such as ontological dependence.


Thanks to Marianna Antonutti, Chris Daly and Frédérique Janssen-Lauret for comments.