Philosophy of Microbiology

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Maureen A. O'Malley, Philosophy of Microbiology, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 269pp., $31.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107621503.

Reviewed by Ellen Clarke, All Souls College, University of Oxford


Microbes have stood in need of rehabilitation in the public imagination since their long days as bad guys, as dirty causes of disease. This image change is now in full swing, with yoghurt adverts reminding us that some microbes are vital to our health and asthma researchers urging us to cease our pursuit of a sterile home. The biotech bubble may have burst, but the science of microbiology has never have been more important, with our tiny friends playing an ever increasing role in processing our waste, producing our medicines and our food, and with potential implications for tackling obesity, climate change, antibiotic resistance and more.

This book shows how, in addition, microbes are guiding our biological research and our overall picture of life. Maureen O'Malley presents a sustained defence of microbial life as pivotal to all of the processes that humans, biologists and especially philosophers of biology care about. She shows how microbiological research is interesting for those thinking about modelling, about species concepts and other areas of systematics, about ecology, and about evolution. She makes two central pleas. One is for microbes to be given a much more central place within philosophy of biology. The other is for philosophers (and biologists?) to consider placing metabolism at the centre of a radically reorganised understanding of the living world, in which multi-lineal, higher-level entities take precedence over lower-level units.

The book has six chapters and a significant introduction and conclusion. The introduction includes an initial defence of the centrality of microbes within biology: they make up a large fraction of total biodiversity; they underpin the planet's biogeochemistry; they have been majority foci of evolution; and they interact metabolically with most other life forms.

Chapter One argues that microbiology throws up distinctively philosophical problems (lessons for philosophy, rather than for microbiology itself) via the presentation of two case studies. The first claims that proper attention to microbiology supports a major reinterpretation of major transitions theory; the second claims that philosophers of cognition have misinterpreted the biological facts in using magnetotactic bacteria as a model of primitive representational capacity.

Chapters Two and Three concern classification. Three offers a good summary of recent work demonstrating the need to revise our notion of 'species' and of a tree of life, in light of microbial phenomena. Two is more novel, and articulates fascinating complexities in the pursuit of high-level classification. Most of us have heard about Carl Woese's revolutionary redrawing of top-level classification into three domains, but only now, after reading O'Malley's story, do I begin to appreciate the methodological but also conceptual decisions implied by this. One problem for the three-domain view is that some people think eukaryotes are probably the product of an endosymbiotic event that fused a bacterium with an archaeon (55), meaning that eukarya is a polyphyletic group, and eukaryotes are genetic chimeras. We are forced to weigh the competing meta-classificatory principles of monophyly versus evaluation of transformative evolutionary events. O'Malley distils an overwhelming amount of detail to show how disorientating the matter of sorting things into categories can be. One is left with the impression that there is just only so far that empirical data can go in resolving the core disputes, and that further progress depends on a greater reception of exactly the kind of careful philosophical analysis that O'Malley offers.

The few things that do seem certain are that biological variation exists in a vast array of subtle shades and grades, that emerging and future technologies will reveal more of these subtleties, and that any recognition of important distinctions needs to be tempered with careful argumentation about why and how such distinctions are being made. (60)

Two is a standout chapter, although it might have been easier going if there had been an earlier introduction to general classificatory issues. There is a really illuminating discussion of terminology, in which O'Malley spells out problems associated with some of the commonly used labels 'prokaryote' (a purely negative term, meaning 'not a eukaryote'); 'bacteria' (often used to mean all microbes, but excludes archaea); 'protist' (a sort of conceptual bin for anything small and hard to classify). 'Microbe' as 'anything too small to see without a microscope' isn't perfect either -- especially given that some known bacteria are up to 1mm long -- but it stands as a reasonable umbrella term. O'Malley uses it to include bacteria, archaea, protists (unicellular eukaryotes) and viruses, but makes no assumption that it is a natural group.

Evolutionary biology has often been criticised for its bias towards 'charismatic vertebrates.' Chapter Four asks "Do microbes have their own evolutionary rules?" O'Malley answers via a fascinating tour through some recent 'hot topics' in microbiology, including lateral gene transfer, directed mutation, evolvability and endosymbiosis, as well as a brief diversion into the various species of Lamarckism. Ultimately she walks a line between emphasizing how many of the standard assumptions of the modern synthesis come under threat in a microbial context, and upholding her recurrent 'unity of life' theme that insists that evolution just is microbial. She makes a good point along the way about practitioners of evolutionary developmental biology ('evodevo') missing a trick by maintaining their exclusive focus on metazoans (122). Some very interesting work will surely come of thinking about the emergence of multicellular development out of unicellular development (for example, Nedelcu and Michod 2004).

Chapter Five, on microbial ecology, is another standout. O'Malley traces the history of the field and shows how it developed, independently of both mainstream, pure-culture microbiology and of non-microbial ecology, all the way up to its recent molecular incarnation in metagenomics. She again does an outstanding job of detailing both the arguments and the evidence marshalled during the historical development of the field.

Chapter Six considers microbes as models. O'Malley outlines the central role played by microbes in the molecular revolution, as tools and as model systems. She gives the best explanations I have read of how molecular innovations have informed and created fields, from systematics to systems biology and synthetic biology (180). She gives a careful analysis of the sense in which microbes can model macrobes. It's not that "microbes [are] the basic no-frills system, with the sophisticated biology building on and elaborating such systems" (195). Microbes are not simpler versions of macrobes. What they are instead is hugely tractable exemplars of many features that are general to all life. Tractable because they have small, easily sequenced genomes, because they evolve in real time, because we can sometimes hold their genetics fixed by working with pure cultures, and can exert a high level of control over their environment. We can easily insert genes and various markers, in real time, and can revisit previous experiments in frozen cultures.

O'Malley urges confidence in the generalizability of microbial findings to other species, founded in a general commitment to a unified view of life. "It makes more sense to work 'upwards', in the sense of small to large: find your generalizations in the most common and pervasive life forms and then work out where to put your occasional anomalies such as animals" (131). Nonetheless, we must guard against overenthusiasm in applying microbiological tools to inappropriate tasks. There is an expression, 'Give a boy a hammer and the world becomes a nail'. The very ease with which bacterial experiments can be conducted should not obscure the existence of deep ambiguities about the comparability of, say, a peacock's tail to P. aeruginosa's production of an iron-scavenging molecule, as evolved adaptations. For social evolution theorists, a trait is only an adaptation if it is the product of a selection process (as elsewhere), yet experimentally they say it is enough if the trait is maintained by selection (e.g., Ghoul et al 2014), which is a significantly lower bar. For how long must it be maintained? Under what strength of selection? These are not concerns I have seen being addressed. Similarly, it's not clear that 'fitness' doesn't subtly change in meaning when we move from the laboratory to the field, let alone to the macroscopic level. I don't want to imply that O'Malley commits any wrongdoing here: she is consistently careful to avoid over-dramatic conclusions. In fact, her work stands as an excellent first shot in what needs to be an ongoing discussion about the relation between laboratory and field in biology generally.

The conclusion collects some heterogeneous musings about microbial conservation (What should we save from extinction: whales and pandas, or ammonia oxidisers? (204)), origins of life research, and the aims of philosophy of science.

General points

An awe-inspiring amount of synthesis has gone into this work. It would be easy to read all this without realising how hard-won must be O'Malley's broad and careful overall understanding of how the fields of genomics, microbiology, systems biology, synthetic biology and so on have evolved, and how they relate to one another. The pace of change in biology, of construction of new physical buildings to house new schools of thought, has been dizzying. O'Malley achieves a cautious representation of opposed voices in a dizzying multitude of complex and cutting edge debates, from the adaptive value of lateral gene transfer (104-05) to neutral versus niche-based theories of community assembly (165). At times I felt she represented microbiology as a more unified field than it really is, focusing on consensus rather than controversy. This is reasonable, because it's better to talk about mature aspects of the science. Nevertheless, some controversies are obscured in O'Malley's narrative, and claims presented as harmonious when inconsistency and controversy lurks beneath. For example, she relays findings of social evolution theory (110) alongside descriptions of emergent community capacities such as biofilm life cycles (120) and phenotype switching (123), in such a way that most readers won't realise that there are deep seated oppositions between these perspectives concerning issues such as reductionism, modelling versus experimental work, and ecological context-dependence (see, for example, Rainey et al 2014).

I wasn't persuaded by Chapter One's argument that a major transition should be redefined as an event that results in a major new metabolic capability (22). O'Malley here contrasts Paul Falkowski's metabolic account of transitions, which includes events such as the origin of photosynthesis, with Maynard Smith and Szathmáry's focus on changes in informational mechanisms (1995). I found some problems with the analysis offered. Firstly, most authors now writing about major transitions subscribe to a compositional view, on which a major transition is an event that produces a new kind of individual, by aggregating lower-level individuals (Michod 1999; Okasha 2006; Fisher et al 2014). This was part of Maynard Smith and Szathmáry's original schema, alongside the bit about transmission of information. The latter part has largely been dropped, because without it we can achieve a more theoretically unified list of transitions. The transitions to eukaryocity (conceived as an endosymbiotic event), to multicellularity and to eusociality are our paradigm transitions, and in each case a new higher-level individual is created by aggregation of lower-level parts. In this compositional view, endosymbiotic events are taken just as seriously as O'Malley hopes and criticisms directed at inconsistency in the use of 'information' find no target. This is not to say that it isn't interesting to think about other watershed events in evolutionary history, such as the origin of photosynthesis, or the population of the land, or the origin of flight. But there is nothing in this chapter to persuade adherents of the existing 'major transitions' literature that, in light of microbiological research, their "model may need to be replaced by another framework" (24). Of course some key figures in transitions theory, such as Stuart West and Paul Rainey, are microbiologists themselves.

I would have liked to see more detail about methodologies here. What are genomicists actually doing . . . what is their data, what are its problems? For example, O'Malley gives a summary (102) of lateral gene transfer's history and talks about its suspected prevalence, including the idea that operational genes are transferred more often than informational genes, but says nothing about current methods for detecting lateral transfer. Most times this is done by phylogenetic inference. If a gene is spotted in a surprising place -- i.e., it is common in a distant clade but only present in a small part of the focal clade -- then lateral transfer into the focal clade is inferred. This methodology surely has implications for our estimations of the frequency with which transfer actually occurs, because we'll only register that genes have been transferred if they are maintained by subsequent selection in the recipient clade. This might illuminate long-term patterns of horizontal inheritance but won't, for example, help much in deciding the extent to which lateral transfer enables biofilms to use genes as a "'floating' adaptive resource" (104).

How sharp are the main axes that O'Malley here grinds -- for metabolism and for microbial centrality? All the pieces fit together. For example, if you buy her metabolic perspective on things, then it is implied that the fundamental units of life are collaborative associations between multiple lineages (for example, a human being plus all of its commensal microbes), and because no collaboration on earth exists entirely independently of some microbe or other, it is implied that nothing on earth can be understood without understanding microbes. On the other hand, if you don't buy the metabolic starting point, then none of this follows. The argument for the fundamentality of metabolism (over informational or evolutionary perspectives) is somewhat scattered. Bits of it are found in Chapter One (metabolic capacities, especially the evolution of photosynthesis, have caused important turning points in evolutionary history, e.g., the great oxidation event (17); microbial metabolism is vital for life as we know it (21)), and bits in the conclusion (a metabolism view avoids the "chauvinism of a directional view" (213). I wonder why O'Malley doesn't draw on other figures who have argued for metabolic views, such as Maturana and Varela 1980, Gánti 1987, and so on?

With so much resting on the metabolic view -- the suggestion to reorganise major transitions (22), the definition of the organism (156) and the redefinition of evolvability (127) -- there really needs to be more in the way of explicit argument for it. O'Malley goes so far as to suggest that we swap the selfish gene view for a "selfish metabolism" view (130). This is by far and away the most novel, radical thesis in the book, but its stands undeveloped. The claim about metabolism is made very cautiously. O'Malley limits herself most of the time to saying "it is possible to see things this way" and "an alternative view point is". And maybe such gestalt shifting is enough. After all, the deeply embedded assumptions that she tackles are open to challenge only in so far as alternatives are available, and while it isn't the line she takes on the purpose of philosophy of science (208), many of us will understand the field as fulfilling one valuable function by sheltering alternatives to prevailing conceptual orthodoxies.

What of the second axe, the primacy of microbes and microbiology to philosophy and biology? There are various strands to O'Malley's claim here. At the conservative end, she wants to correct what has been an undoubted bias towards "charismatic vertebrates" by evolutionary biologists and philosophers of biology. A more extreme claim is that microbiology ought to be the starting point for all discussions within philosophy of biology.

O'Malley details many good reasons why microbes have instrumental importance to humans. They are vital to maintaining a habitable biosphere. As symbiotes they are essential for our health and to that of all the other life forms that we eat or otherwise depend on. As metabolic tools they have become invaluable in producing many of the chemicals and substances we use. Yet, in order to secure her claims about the philosophical centrality of microbes, O'Malley needs to go further than these instrumental values. She has three lines of argument: from experimental tractability, from classificatory dominance, and from processual generality. The latter has two strands -- microbes as major players in the processes of evolution (because microbes outnumber macrobes and have existed for much longer (197), because most evolution on earth has been microbial evolution, and because all novel metabolic capacities evolved in microbes) and of ecology (macrobes depend on microbes and live commensally with them, microbial biogeochemical processes make life on earth possible (198)). Together, these are intended to persuade us that any person concerned with trying to understand life ought to take microbes as central and foundational to all of their investigations.

Yet it is hard to pin down exactly the sort of importance or priority O'Malley has in mind. It is true that "microbes cannot easily be left out of any general discussion of how life organises itself" (41), but then neither should anything else be. This hardly justifies O'Malley's comparative claim, "Microbes are superior to macrobes, for philosophical purposes at least" (196.) This is an astonishing claim. Superior in what sense? A better argument against neglecting microbes is from evolutionary biology. The theory of natural selection must be formulated in such a way that it is able to explain how macrobes emerged from a microbial foundation. Here we can appeal to temporal asymmetry to prioritise the study of life forms with a greater number of downstream evolutionary consequences. But at whose expense ought the greater attention to microbes be given . . . insects? Plants? Biochemistry? In her privileging of microbes over macrobes, its almost as if O'Malley misses the point that we humans are macrobes, that we eat macrobes and keep them as our pets. Of course we are disproportionately interested in humans. She calls microbes the "most important, diverse and ancient life forms on our planet" (1), but I doubt that any reader will be persuaded on the first point. She is much more plausible on the neglect of microbiology by philosophy of biology, "an ill-founded and passively reproduced habit" for which her book is a "partial antidote" and "part of a new wave of philosophy of biology with a growing appreciation for microorganismal life" (42).

All in all, O'Malley has created a marvellous resource for anyone who needs an exhaustive overview of recent methodological trends and hot topics in microbiology, or wants an historically informed explanation of how different areas and fruits of microbiology fit together. Microbiologists reading might stand to be disappointed by the lack of sweeping claims and philosophical exotica: Philosophy of Microbiology is consistently careful and cautious, and an impressive display of scholarship. O'Malley shows that her anonymous correspondent is surely mistaken in thinking that microbes are "incredibly boring critters" (11). And while I'm not inclined to follow her all the way to calling microbes the most important organisms on earth, or to having microbiology as the foundation and starting point for all discussion in philosophy of biology, her weaker conclusion "keep microbes in mind!" is one that I can unhesitatingly endorse.


Gánti, T. 1987. The principle of life. OMIKK.

Ghoul, M., Griffin, A. S. and West, S. A. 2013. 'Towards an evolutionary definition of cheating'. Evolution 68(2): 318-31.

Maturana, H.R. and Varela, F.J. 1980. 'Autopoiesis and cognition: the realization of the living'. In: Boston studies in the philosophy and history of science, vol 42. D. Reidl, Dordrecht.

Maynard Smith, J. and Szathmáry, E. 1995. The major transitions in evolution. Oxford University Press.

Michod, R. E. 1999. Darwinian dynamics: Evolutionary transitions in fitness and individuality. Princeton University Press.

Nedelcu, A. M. and Michod, R. E. 2004. 'Evolvability, modularity and individuality during the transition to multicellularity in volvocalean green algae', In Schlosser, G. and Wagner, G. (eds.) Modularity in development and evolution, pp. 468-489. University of Chicago Press.

Okasha, S. 2006. Evolution and the levels of selection. Oxford University Press.

Rainey, P.B., Desprat, N., Driscoll, W.M. and Zhang, X. 2014. 'Microbes are not bound by sociobiology: Response to Kümmerli and Ross-Gillespie'. Evolution 68(11): 3344-55.

West, S. A., Fisher, R. A., Gardner, A. and Kiers, T. Forthcoming. 'The major evolutionary transitions in individuality'. PNAS.