Philosophy of Mind and Phenomenology: Conceptual and Empirical Approaches

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Daniel O. Dahlstrom, Andreas Elpidorou, and Walter Hopp (eds.), Philosophy of Mind and Phenomenology: Conceptual and Empirical Approaches, Routledge, 2016, 334pp., $148.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415705561.

Reviewed by Stephan Käufer, Franklin & Marshall College


This is the second volume in a new series from Routledge dedicated to publishing contributions from phenomenologists to current issues in philosophy. Volumes three and four are set to come out shortly, and three more volumes are on deck for next year. The series in general is well edited. It selects interesting topics, and solicits work from a refreshing range of authors, including lesser-known, younger writers as well as some whose interest in phenomenology is recent. This volume on the philosophy of mind (not to be confused with an excellent 2006 Oxford anthology called Phenomenology and Philosophy of Mind) is stimulating. It will give readers with an interest in philosophy of mind a lot of ideas to consider. The volume as a whole makes a compelling case for integrating more phenomenology into mainstream work on the mind and cognitive science.

To their credit the editors have not tried to corral their contributors' views into a single stance. Phenomenology comes in many flavors and philosophy of mind is a broad field, so we get here a somewhat loose parade of titles, including several essays that address core phenomenological themes such as introspection and embodiment, but also some work on more marginal topics such as dreams, boredom, and medical imagery.

Among the main phenomenological traditions, the essays draw heavily on Husserl, especially the chapters by David Woodruff Smith, Daniel O. Dahlstrom, Walter Hopp, Jeffrey Yoshimi, and Mark Rowlands. There are also original contributions by Dan Zahavi and Uriah Kriegel and by Shaun Gallagher that further develop these authors' well-established work on phenomenology and cognitive science, which itself fits a mostly Husserlian mould. Dermot Moran provides a clear and enjoyable, albeit compressed, survey of the importance of Husserl's notion of the lived body in a century of phenomenological work. He touches upon version of the body in Beauvoir, Stein, Merleau-Ponty and Levinas, but of course cannot develop these in much detail. Sartre is also fairly prominent in this volume. He is the main phenomenological source for Jonathan Webber's essay on desires, Nicolas de Warren on dreams, and Andreas Elpidorou on boredom. Merleau-Ponty is the topic of an insightful original essay by Komarine Romdenh-Romluc and appears briefly in a few others. Perhaps surprisingly, Heidegger goes mostly missing, except for one essay on his account of mood by Lauren Freeman.

With this broad preference for Husserlian phenomenology, the volume gives the impression that the most promising and fruitful overlap between phenomenology and the philosophy of mind lies in the introspective analysis of consciousness. Though the editors' introduction defines phenomenology more broadly as an "examination of human experience that takes the first-personal character of experience to be fundamental" (1), this mineness of experience is usually approached here in terms of phenomenal consciousness. This slant largely de-emphasizes the contributions to philosophy of mind that derive from the work of Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty, who undermine the focus on consciousness by analyzing the essential role skillful competences and bodily dispositions play in our intentional comportment towards the world. On at least one influential reading, Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty's views conflict with Husserl's transcendental reflection on consciousness. Several productive strands of current anti-Cartesian cognitive science are more or less directly influenced by this phenomenology of skills and the body. The sensorimotor approach, dynamical systems theory, and embodied cognitive science, for example, bear in significant ways on the philosophy of mind, but they appear only occasionally in this collection.

As if to defuse a possible tension between two phenomenological camps, the last essay, Rowlands' "Bringing Philosophy Back," aims for a kind of reconciliation between Husserlian phenomenology and these anti-Cartesian, body- and skill-based approaches. Rowlands argues that the general motivation for what he calls "4e cognition" (extended, embodied, enactive, embedded) is usually couched in terms of a broad functionalism. An entity counts as part of the cognitive system if it functions as such, and that can be said of external things (such as the notes in Otto's notebook, in Andy Clark and David Chalmers' well-known example), embodied processes, etc. Such reliance on functionalism, however, leaves 4e-ers struggling to specify and individuate the appropriate entities that count as part of the cognitive system. Is it the note in the notebook, the reading of the note, the disposition to get out the notebook, or any other of many possible candidates that actually performs the relevant function? Best to drop the reliance on functionalism. In its place, Rowlands claims, we should put an interpretation of intentionality as activity that discloses an aspect of the world and directs us intentionally to it. Thus interpreted, 4e-type views show up as immediate, "even banal," consequences of intentionality (323). Bodily movements, explorative activity, head-tilting, consulting the notebook -- they are all activities that help us disclose aspects of the world for our intentionality.

Far from undermining Husserl's phenomenological focus on consciousness, this interpretation of intentionality is best cashed out precisely in terms of Husserl's distinction between noesis and noema. Intentionality is a transcendental notion; it is the meaning-structure that makes it possible for any given intentional object to appear to us and make sense to us. It is not an aspect of the object, nor the causal vehicle of the appearance, but our directedness towards the world. Intentional states, Rowlands' concludes, are items "with which we are aware," rather than items of which we are aware (322). And since we are often aware of things with our bodies, or by means of tools, these things can quite trivially count as mental items. This is an interesting and thought-provoking proposal for avoiding the uneasy reliance on functionalism. It is not clear, however, whether the notion of the "transcendental" recovered from Husserl's noesis/noema distinction is the best way to make sense of intentionality in general. Interpretations of motor-intentionality have long maintained that we are conscious with our bodies, rather than of our bodies, and even with the tools that we wield competently. As Merleau-Ponty says, we merge with these tools, and the blind man, for example, is aware of the world at the end of his cane, not the cane itself. The claim that competent, habitual users of tools merge with them and in a sense incorporate them is not a functionalist claim, but a phenomenological one. Perhaps this phenomenology of motor-intentions fits Rowlands reading, but it hardly seems banal.

Yoshimi's "Prospects for a Naturalized Phenomenology" raises the pertinent point that it is not at all obvious that phenomenology has any kind of privilege over the first-personal character of experience. If phenomenology is to make substantial contributions to naturalizable areas of philosophy of mind, it must itself become clear on the status of claims derived from the phenomenological method. Insofar as this method, in its Husserlian guise, relies centrally on introspection, there is cause for caution. Citing Eric Schwitzgebel's work on this topic, Yoshimi argues that introspection is hardly infallible, and frequently not trustworthy. It seems unwarranted to claim that phenomenology has a unique ability to inject a particular kind of insight about first-personal experiences. Eidetic variation, reduction, and other methodological subtleties do little to allay such skepticism. Phenomenology, Yoshimi finds, is subject to the same historical development that first removed introspection from experimental psychology, and then reintroduced a less ambitious version of it, subject to the checks of careful experimental design. Seen in such context, the contributions of phenomenology nevertheless turn out to be substantial and important. But they are not vested in introspection, but rather in the richness of its examples, taken as data to be explained, and the holistic nature of its overall interpretations of human experience that can take results and explanations of particular experiences and weave them into an overall, coherent system. Phenomenology and cognitive science, then, are best seen as reciprocally coupled, and evolving together.

Rowlands' and Yoshimi's essays address the important meta-question on what grounds and to what extent phenomenology belongs in the philosophy of mind. The other essays get straight to work on specific applications of it. Dan Lloyd's "Hearing, Seeing, and Music in the Middle" provides a rich and challenging application of Yoshimi's suggestion. Phenomenology has often focused on vision as its primary source of examples. The occasional examination of auditory experiences raises questions about how these two phenomenologies fit together. Lloyd points out that prima facie there are important differences. Vision is instantaneous and rich, providing a plenum of the visual world, and is anchored in multiple points of view as the observer moves about the environment. Hearing requires time, as memory and interpretation work on constructing an object out of a temporal flow of stimuli. Vision, Lloyd writes, "affords a world of objects, while audition affords a world of events" (207).

For sure, Lloyd here underplays the similarities. Vision, too, takes time insofar as the relevant visual information often consists of the change of some variable over time. And hearing, too, involves active physical movement, as we turn and tilt our heads and bodies to adjust the directionality of our pinnae, and to reconcile binaural differences in sound intensity and timing. But his overall observation is on the mark. Phenomenological cognitive science faces the task of reconciling these descriptions, so that we can make sense of a single organism disclosing a single world. As Merleau-Ponty puts it, we must understand the perceptual world as "inter-sensory" and even understand our senses as "synesthetic," i.e. as having overlapping modalities, so that we can see stickiness, weight or brittleness. Lloyd's proposal points the way to neurophenomenology, an integration of the physical, or neurological investigation of the senses and the phenomenological description of the relevant experiences. As an example Lloyd considers the fact that different color wavelengths blend into the experience of a single color while different frequencies of pressure waves harmonize into the experience of hearing a multi-tonal chord. We can explain this difference physically and physiologically, by learning how neurotransmitters transduce the relevant stimuli in the visual and auditory systems. And each such explanation "is at the same time a bit of phenomenology waiting to be translated from the objective language of action potentials to the subjective language of sights and sounds" (216). Of course the translation goes in the other direction as well, as phenomenological descriptions should shape the questions asked by physiology, psychology, and neurology of perception. So, for instance, Merleau-Ponty's view that the unity of our perceptual modalities is to be explained by the unity of our lived bodies should prompt study of the mechanisms by which sensory stimuli are affected and amplified by motor responses.

Gallagher's "The Minds of Others" brings phenomenology to bear on the question of how we know the consciousness or mental states of others, what is sometimes called the 'problem of empathy'. Two prominent approaches in current cognitive science are "theory theory" and "simulation theory." Both of these presume the "unobservability principle," i.e. the view that we do not have any direct experience of other people's minds, because minds are private and accessible only to their owners. Instead we come to know about others' states of mind by either inferring them or experiencing a simulation of them that we produce in our own minds. However, a range of phenomenologists, including Scheler, Husserl, and Merleau-Ponty, claim that we directly perceive somebody else's joy, pain, anger, etc. This claim is in line with the more general phenomenological view that we directly perceive occluded aspects of an object. In a standard example, we see complete houses, not facades. The occluded backside is present in the perception as a Husserlian anticipation, or in Alva Noë's view as a sensorimotor contingency. Coupled with another basic phenomenological claim, that the mind is thoroughly embodied, we can begin to understand mental states not as unobservable, but as occluded aspects of the presentation of other people's bodies in a social context. That such perception of social contexts is a basic human ability is also a fundamental tenet of phenomenology, what Husserl calls 'intersubjectivity', and Heidegger calls 'Mitsein'.

Gallagher weaves the various strands of this phenomenological background into a view of other minds called "interaction theory." Empathy, according to this view, is actually a basic constituent of our experience. The problem of other minds, then, becomes both more tractable and more interesting. The question is not how we get to know others' states of mind, since we always already do. It is rather a question about what other processes of interaction and articulation of our basic experiences make it so that we can experience other minds as other, and as transcendent, as having hidden aspects. There must be higher-level processes that build upon basic social intelligibility to give us familiar experiences of other minds. Gallagher sketches some such processes in the development of our narrative competencies.

Other essays in the collection are well worth a more thorough look than this review allows. Perhaps the essay that most succinctly encapsulates the promise and the challenges of the volume is Zahavi and Kriegel's "For-Me-Ness." For some time Zahavi and Kriegel have argued that for-me-ness is at the core of all phenomenal consciousness. When I (or any conscious being) have an experience, it contains the phenomenal quality that this experience is mine, for me. In this essay they defend that conception against several objections. They liken for-me-ness to Sartrean pre-reflective consciousness. Sartre analyzes pre-reflective experiences -- such as my absorption in reading, or my chasing after a streetcar -- and points out that, on the one hand, they do not contain consciousness of the I, the ego. On the other hand, though, they are experienced from my point of view, or for-me, so they are characterized by a kind of minimal self-awareness, which Sartre calls "non-thetic."

Drawing on this phenomenology, Joe Schear has argued that we should understand for-me-ness as the ability to immediately and unfailingly attribute our pre-reflective, absorbed experiences to ourselves, while rejecting the claim that the self is, even minimally, already part of the absorbed experience. Zahavi and Kriegel reply that such an ability of self-attribution is essentially a disposition, which is best explained on the basis of some categorical feature of the thing so disposed. In this case, the best explanation is that in its minimal, non-thetic way, the for-me-ness is already there. It would be interesting to press this minimal, non-thetic for-me-ness in the quite different direction suggested by the phenomenology of Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty. Rather than reducing mineness to a minimal aspect of phenomenal consciousness, it might turn out that all experience has a mineness that comes to it from the world. It is the world that solicits us, and which we experience as polarized, and only because the self is already "out there" can it show up, irreducibly, in phenomenal consciousness.