Philosophy of Mind

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G. W. F. Hegel, Philosophy of Mind, W. Wallace and A. V. Miller (trans.), Michael Inwood (introduction and commentary), Oxford University Press, 2007, 680pp., $160.00 (hbk), ISBN 019929951X.

Reviewed by Sebastian Rand, Georgia State University


Michael Inwood's major revision of the Wallace and Miller translation of Hegel's Philosophy of Mind is a welcome addition to the English-language Hegel library. It comes at a crucial moment, when Hegel is being reconsidered by many philosophers in the English-speaking world, and this particular Hegelian text ought to be -- and now can be -- central to that reconsideration. While there are some questionable choices made in the translation itself, it is a definite and significant step forward. Inwood has also added an extensive commentary (longer by a third than Hegel's own text) which is informative and often helpful.

The Philosophy of Mind is the final part of Hegel's Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences in Outline. In the last century or so of Hegel scholarship, the Encyclopedia has played a relatively minor role, despite the fact that it lays out the mature form of Hegel's system as that system was taught by Hegel himself (he wrote the Encyclopedia as the basis for his lectures). It has been largely overshadowed by other texts: the Phenomenology of Spirit and the Science of Logic dominated 20th-century discussion of Hegel, while the Philosophy of Right has recently attracted a good deal of attention.

The roots of this canonical situation can be found in the content of the Encyclopedia itself. It is divided into three parts: the Logic, the Philosophy of Nature, and the Philosophy of Mind. The first is essentially a short version of the material presented in great detail in the Science of Logic; the Encyclopedia Logic has thus played second fiddle to the Science of Logic. The Philosophy of Nature is normally taken to present a misguided attempt to deduce the laws and structure of nature from a priori principles; this part of Hegel's system has been widely (and wrongly) scorned since his death.

The Philosophy of Mind itself is divided into three main parts: "Subjective Spirit," "Objective Spirit," and "Absolute Spirit." Much of the content of the latter two (ranging over political philosophy, ethics, aesthetics, philosophy of religion, and metaphilosophy) is developed in detail in the Philosophy of Right and in the posthumously published Lectures on Aesthetics, Lectures on the Philosophy of History, and Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion. Hence "Objective Spirit" and "Absolute Spirit" bear to those texts an analogous relationship to that which the Encyclopedia Logic bears to the Science of Logic -- the former give the skeletal presentation fleshed out by the latter. It can thus appear that much of the content of the Encyclopedia is superseded by other Hegelian texts.

For those convinced that the Encyclopedia Logic, Philosophy of Nature, "Objective Spirit," and "Absolute Spirit" are so superseded (this reviewer is emphatically not one of them), there remains only "Subjective Spirit" as a possible object of interest in the Encyclopedia; but this portion of the Philosophy of Mind presents its own systematic difficulties. Here, in subsections on "Anthropology," "Phenomenology," and "Psychology," Hegel attempts to lay out the structure of subjectivity -- that is, those aspects of our objective experience and knowledge of the world that can be attributed to the "subject" having that experience and knowledge. Yet in doing so he appears to embrace just those Kantian distinctions and terms -- intuition, representation, imagination, etc. -- he is thought to have overthrown as a result of his critical engagement with Kant; the revolutionary young philosopher of the Phenomenology of Spirit, the philosopher of the Unhappy Consciousness and the Master/Slave Dialectic, appears to have reverted to a dry mix of Kantian terminology and Wolffian rationalism tinged with pantheistic mysticism as soon as he was offered an endowed chair.

Inwood's new edition of the Philosophy of Mind should help dispel these prejudices. It offers many advantages over previously available editions, of which there were four: first, the original Wallace translation of Hegel's 1830 edition, published in 1894; second, the Wallace translation augmented by the additions or Zusätze compiled by Hegel's first posthumous editors, translated by Miller, and published in 1971; third, a partial, facing-page translation covering only "Subjective Spirit," by Michael Petry in 1977; and fourth, a translation of the 1817 edition by Stephen Taubenek in 1990. Inwood's edition, billed as a revision of the Wallace/Miller edition of 1971, is in fact frequently more than just a revision. Some sections are revised more lightly than others, but many are revised enough to constitute new translations in their own right.

A detailed, or even a casual, comparison between Inwood's and Miller's translations, shows clearly how far more accurate and usable Inwood's edition is. First, there is the issue of Hegel's phrasing: Inwood largely retains Hegel's periods, punctuation, and emphases, while Wallace often does not. Especially in the Encyclopedia, which has a relatively rigid formal structure on both the large and small scale, this is extremely important. Inwood also excises many insertions of Wallace's which are simply not in the Hegel at all. And perhaps most importantly, Inwood hews closer to Hegel's technical vocabulary. Just to take a few examples (these are all from §445, but are typical): "setzen" is rendered as "positing" in Inwood while it is rendered as "treating" by Wallace; Inwood has "formal" for "formelle" instead of Wallace's "nominal;" and where Wallace sprinkles his translation with things like "to realize" as renderings of "sein" and "werden," Inwood sticks with Hegel's uses of "to be" and "to become," thereby avoiding needless difficulties with the concepts of reality and actuality in Hegel. Likewise, Wallace sometimes renders "für sich" as "actual," complicating the story even further, whereas Inwood renders it as "for itself." One could note many other similar differences.

The most important effect of such changes is that we now have an edition of the Philosophy of Mind in English that allows us to follow closely the twists and turns of Hegel's thought in relation to some of the central questions animating current Hegel scholarship, as well as many of the central questions making Hegel interesting to contemporary philosophers in both the analytic and continental traditions. What are we saying when we ascribe to someone a free will? What is the connection between our embodiedness and our mindedness? Must we, indeed can we, understand our embodiedness -- and perhaps also our mindedness -- only in natural-scientific terms? Is a purely descriptive philosophy of mind possible, or even desirable? To what extent is Hegel a Kantian, to what extent a "post-Kantian," and to what extent is he attempting to reanimate rationalist metaphysics? The Encyclopedia in general gets much of its importance from being the unified presentation of material that is indeed also presented in an isolated fashion elsewhere, and the Philosophy of Mind is the part of the Encyclopedia that includes the systematic answers to such questions. Without a clear view of, e.g., Hegel's understanding of "subjective spirit," its relation to what Kant called "practical philosophy" (subsumed by Hegel under "objective spirit"), and its relation to our status as natural beings, his answers to these questions simply cannot be understood; but such a clear view cannot be gained by means of the previously available translations of the Philosophy of Mind. Thus Inwood's edition is welcome and timely.

That said, there are some curious choices made by Inwood in the translation as a whole -- choices which he does not clearly and forcefully justify. For instance, Inwood warns us in a footnote to his "Introduction" (p. xi note 8) that he will be translating the German "Verstand" as "intellect," though it is normally translated in the Idealist context as "understanding." He gives three reasons for this choice: first, the use of "intellect" for "Verstand" allows the use of "intellectual" for "verstandig," whereas, presumably, no such closely related adjective exists for "understanding;" second, Verstand for Hegel involves division and distinction, whereas "understanding" in English connotes agreement and sympathy; third, the Kantian (and hence Hegelian) distinction between Verstand and Vernunft is meant to mirror the medieval distinction between intellectus and ratio.

Such are the advantages of "intellect" as a translation for "Verstand." Here are some of the disadvantages, none of which are mentioned by Inwood: we lose the connection with other good translations of Hegel, and with the standard translations of Kant, which consistently use "understanding" for "Verstand;" we lose the engagement between the German use of "Verstand" and the English use of "understanding" in Locke, Hume, and others, as well as related terms in other languages (e.g., Leibniz's "entendement"), all of which can plausibly be said to be in play in the Idealist context; we lose the specific impact of Hegel's use of "Intelligenz," since it no longer stands out for its rootedness in the Latin "intellectus;" and we lose the connection between "understanding" and the verb "to understand" (which Inwood does use for "verstehen," but also occasionally for "erkennen"). The disadvantages in this case appear to outweigh the advantages; it is unfortunate that Inwood does not address these issues directly.

One other noteworthy translation decision, also signalled by Inwood in a footnote to his "Introduction" (p. xii note 9), is his choice to abandon the standard translation of "Dasein" as "determinate being." No doubt "determinate being" is awkward (though not more awkward than the "being-there" used by the most recent translation of the Encyclopedia Logic), and it is the fond dream of many a Hegel scholar to find a more suitable translation. Inwood's decision is to translate it ("generally," as he says) by "reality" or "embodiment." He justifies this decision in a somewhat elliptical fashion: first he points out, entirely correctly, that to have "Dasein" in Hegel's sense is to have "a definite character;" secondly, he claims that "Dasein" is usually contrasted with the term "concept." Why exactly these considerations provide justification for translating "Dasein" as "reality" or "embodiment" is not explicitly stated, but presumably there is some sense in which reality and concepts can be profitably contrasted.

Whatever the advantages of such a translation of "Dasein" turn out to be, they will have to overcome at least the following disadvantages: first, "reality" itself already translates Hegel's "Realität," which is a technical term deployed in the Science of Logic (see the Remark to "Quality" in Volume 1, Book 1, Chapter 2), and which has a long and tortured history in Western philosophy and in German Idealism in particular (see, for instance, Kant on the ontological proof, as well as his use of the term "objective reality"). In Hegel's specific case, Realität is merely one version of Dasein, and thus using "reality" as a translation for "Dasein" obscures the extent to which "Dasein" does more work for Hegel than "Realität" can, in his view (it also leaves open the problem of how to contrast the two terms while preserving Inwood's translation choice). Second, Hegel has a term for "embodiment:" "Verkörperung," which is used precisely, though infrequently. Third, Inwood does not even consistently use "reality" to render "Dasein;" so we find him in §382 translating "Dasein" as "life," which, given the role of the notion of life and the organic in Hegel's philosophy, is highly problematic. It is troubling to see such major terminological changes made with such scant discussion, and it can tend to undermine one's confidence in the translation, despite its obvious superiority to the Wallace and Miller edition.

From a scholarly point of view, there is one other unfortunate aspect of the text of the Philosophy of Mind as presented in this edition. During Hegel's lifetime, the entire Encyclopedia was published as a series of numbered sections. Each of those sections contained one or more main body paragraphs; many of them also came with another set of one or more paragraphs, marked as "Remarks" or Anmerkungen. Hegel himself set the Remarks off from the main body paragraphs by means of indentation, and this has generally been preserved in subsequent editions. In the first posthumous edition of the Encyclopedia, many sections also came with "Additions" or Zusätze complied from various manuscripts and student notes (some of which are now missing) by Hegel's executors and editors; this was done to provide the Encyclopedia with a printed form of the oral elaboration Hegel always claimed it required. Given their far more questionable textual status, these Zusätze are now almost always printed in smaller typeface than the main text and Remarks, in order to make it clear to readers when they are dealing with "official" Hegelian text and when they are dealing with something else.

Inwood's edition does away with both of these formatting conventions, and the result is a book with a deceptively uniform visual presentation, in which vital distinctions between sources, and hence the very nature of the texts in question, are obscured. Granted, the Remarks are marked as such with the word "Remark" in brackets, and the Zusätze with the word "Zusatz;" and granted, diligent readers can be expected to make the appropriate distinctions on their own. Inwood also indicates, briefly, the different status of the Zusätze in the "Introduction." But why not simply follow the formatting conventions? This truly seems like a needless confusion, and it is one that could prove genuinely dangerous to readers who are not sufficiently aware of the interpretive issues at stake.

Last but certainly not least, there is the extensive commentary in the form of endnotes. These notes actually take up substantially more space in the volume than Hegel's own text (385 pages for the notes; 279 for Hegel's text). The notes tend to take on one or more of the following tasks: providing historical background to a term or claim; providing internal cross-reference to another part of the Encyclopedia, or to other Hegelian texts; providing reference to secondary literature; and providing interpretive reconstructions of arguments and/or conceptual distinctions.

In performing the first three of these tasks, Inwood's notes do an admirable job; he is particularly thorough as regards cross-references. But it is performing the last task that counts as providing a commentary. Unfortunately, notes are not the best format in which to perform that task, since their interrupted structure presents an inherent obstacle to providing a unified, coherent interpretation. This is not to say that these notes will not be helpful to readers; I imagine they will be, particularly as readers strive to grasp some obscure Hegelian distinctions. Inwood is keen in his notes to isolate arguments and conceptual distinctions, and this can be very helpful indeed, even as it tends to underemphasize the plastic and synthetic aspect of Hegelian dialectic.

Readers will, however, still be left to generate their own unified view of the text and the way it fits into the rest of the Hegelian corpus, or to assemble such a view from the notes. This is not a bad thing in itself. But it makes one wonder why Inwood and Oxford did not limit the notes to the historical, cross-reference, and secondary reference tasks, and provide a unified commentary as a separate volume. That way the bulk of this volume (and presumably its price as well) would be reduced, and readers interested in having a detailed guide through the text could have one capable of providing a unified picture of the movement of Hegel's thought, instead of the necessarily fragmented and interrupted insights that can be brought across in a series of notes. The result would be particularly welcome given the scarcity of monographs on this text in English (and the relative dearth of such monographs even in German).

Overall, then, this new edition of the Philosophy of Mind is welcome, while it leaves room for improvement. Since there appears to be a fair amount of activity in the world of Hegel translation these days, perhaps it will have some competition before too long. In the meantime, Inwood has provided a much-improved translation of an absolutely central text, along with a helpful set of notes that provide a fine starting-point for genuine historical and contemporary engagement with one of Hegel's most rewarding works.