Philosophy of Personal Identity and Multiple Personality

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Logi Gunnarsson, Philosophy of Personal Identity and Multiple Personality, Routledge, 2010, 230pp., $118.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415800174.

Reviewed by John P. Lizza, Kutztown University of Pennsylvania



Logi Gunnarsson’s Philosophy of Personal Identity and Multiple Personality focuses on the question of whether it is possible for more than one person (understood as a “fundamental entity” and not merely a set of personality or character traits) to exist in a single human body. His purview is “multiple personality” broadly defined to include the psychiatric phenomena of “multiple personality disorder” or, as it is officially called today, “dissociative identity disorder,” as well as fictional cases and thought-experimental cases involving doppelgangers. For details he draws on three main sources: Morton Prince’s seminal work, The Dissociation of a Personality, Amongst Ourselves: A Self-Help Guide to Living with Dissociative Identity Disorder by Tracy Alderman and Karen Marshall, and the 1996 novel, Fight Club, by Chuck Palahniuk. After developing a theory of personal identity, Gunnarsson applies it in an analysis of the cases. He concludes that, although the metaphysics of personal identity allows for the possibility of more than one person in a single human body, there are probably no actual cases and the fictional cases, as described, do not warrant that interpretation. Despite some reservations that I have concerning his overall approach and some questions about some of his specific arguments, his book is a fine contribution to the discussion of the phenomenon of multiple personality and, more broadly, to issues of personal identity. The analysis is sharp; the writing, clear and succinct.

The work is divided into three parts. Part I is mainly introductory and begins with an overview of the main issues concerning personal identity: What am I fundamentally? What accounts for my individuation and diachronic identity as the same fundamental entity? What accounts for the individuation and diachronic identity of a personality of such a fundamental entity? Who am I or what is my “true” self? What is a person in a descriptive sense? How is the moral status person to be understood and what gives an entity this status? Gunnarsson focuses on the first two questions and treats them as independent of the kind of considerations raised by the last two descriptive and evaluative questions. Although the first question is framed with the use of the personal pronoun, his answer deliberately avoids reliance on a concept of person and seeks to explicate our fundamental nature in terms of agency, psychological relations, and responsibility. This puts his work in the mainstream analytical discussion of personal identity, where the theories have attempted to understand personal identity in terms of some internal relation between psychological or physical states. In my view, such approaches mistakenly tend to ignore or reject the idea that persons are essentially relational beings or socially constructed, such that their conditions for individuation and identification cannot be given independently of how they stand in relation to others. Such a constructivist view may not assume a sharp distinction between the descriptive and evaluative nature of persons and accordingly may be incompatible with the idea that there is some purely philosophical or metaphysical account of personal identity independent of considerations of the psycho-social relations, cultural embeddedness, and moral considerations of persons. For this reason, I find that Gunnarsson’s approach, like a good deal of the mainstream analytical discussion of personal identity, is limited in its consideration of what is relevant to answering the main questions.

Another aspect of Gunnarsson’s approach that I find puzzling concerns his use of the term “fundamental entity.” In contrast to Eric Olson and David Wiggins, he does not assume that the answer to the question “What am I fundamentally?” must specify a substance concept. Thus, he writes,

What I am fundamentally may not be anything that is somehow ontologically fundamental. For example, it may be that humans are ontologically more fundamental than persons. This does not exclude the possibility that the correct answer to the question ‘What am I fundamentally?’ is ‘a person.’ In other words, what I am fundamentally may not be a substance (p. 196, fn. 8).

Gunnarsson, however, never clarifies what he means by “fundamental,” if he does not understand it in some ontological sense. Moreover, his main thesis about multiple personality relies on a notion of agency that presupposes that we are more than simply bundles of psychological states. If not bundles of states, why not understand the agent, i.e., the fundamental entity that he thinks we are, as a substance of some psychological kind, for example, along lines suggested by E. J. Lowe?

Despite these initial reservations, what Gunnarsson accomplishes in the vein of the mainstream analytical discussion is significant. Part I continues with a succinct overview of the main theories of diachronic personal identity, distinguishing between the non-circular, empirical theories of biological continuity, psychological continuity, and bodily continuity and the non-empirical, circular theories of continuity of the same mental entity (dualism) and continuity of an inner, first-person perspective. He identifies two main problems for the empirical, non-circular theories. Both are familiar from the literature. First, by assuming the “only x and y principle” (that the diachronic identity of x and y can only depend on factors intrinsic to x, y or the relations between them), empirical theories cannot account for cases of duplication. Gunnarsson offers the case of Fair who undergoes an operation in which two successors, L-Fairchild and R-Fairchild, are each given one of the halves of Fair’s brain. If only L-Fairchild exists, the empirical theories hold that L-Fairchild is identical to Fair. However, if both successors exist and the same relation holds between each successor and Fair, then the empirical theories would seem to imply that both are identical to Fair. However, since L-Fairchild is not identical to R-Fairchild, the transitivity of identity shows that the empirical theory must be false. The second problem is that the empirical theories cannot account for the “unity reaction” — the intuition that it is possible that after undergoing an operation such as Fair receives, one would wake up with the feelings of one of the successors but not the other, even though there is no empirically describable difference between the connections of Fair to each of the successors. If this is possible, then the empirical, non-circular theories must be false. The main problem for non-empirical, circular theories is that they cannot explain why a person is the same person after awaking from a coma. Since such theories deny that any empirical continuity can guarantee that the same person exists over time, they provide no more reason for thinking that the same person exists than that the same person does not exist. Gunnarsson concludes that any adequate theory of personal identity must meet three conditions of adequacy: solve the duplication problem, account for the truth of the “unity reaction,” and accept empirical criteria of diachronic identity to avoid the coma problem.

Gunnarsson notes that “the unity reaction is a reaction from the first-person perspective” and that it implies nothing about fission cases in general or what to say about cases such the Ship of Theseus (p. 32). He then states that the unity reaction provides a criterion of adequacy “only to questions about ”“>our identity” and that “This fits in with my interpretation of the identity of fundamental entities as an issue concerning the conditions of identity of human beings who can ask the question ‘What am I?’” (p. 32). Although Gunnarsson promises early on not to preclude any answers to the question "What am I fundamentally?", this assumption about what is at issue precludes the possibility of animalism being true. Since mentality, including the ability to ask the question "What am I?“, is irrelevant to the animalist answer to what we are fundamentally, ”SpellE">Gunnarsson has ruled out animalism from the start by requiring that any adequate theory of personal identity must account for the truth of the “unity reaction.” Later in the work, he endorses Lowe’s criticism of the “cinematographic fallacy” in Olson’s animalism that mistakenly denies how conditions of diachronic identity are necessary to explain qualitative differences (p. 66). Gunnarsson also holds that he cannot be identical to a fetus or an individual in a permanent vegetative state, since the diachronic identity of the kind of fundamental entity that he is talking about - dare I say an “I” or “person” - requires the ability to have mental functions. While I think that there are significant difficulties with animalism and that Gunnarsson points out some of them in the work, his assumption about what it means to ask the question “What am I fundamentally?” that rules out animalism from the start is significant in the context of a discussion of whether more than one fundamental entity may exist in a single human body over time. Since animalism identifies the “I” with the biological organism, there is only one fundamental entity as long as that organism exists. Animalism, if true, would thus present a major challenge to Gunnarsson’s co-existence thesis, the view that it is possible for more than one fundamental entity to exist in a single human body.

In Part II, Gunnarsson develops his empirical, circular philosophical theory of personal identity over time. He begins by criticizing psychological continuity theories of personal identity, such as Parfit’s, on grounds that they misinterpret the significance of everyday belief revision for personal identity. According to the psychological continuity criterion, P1 and P2 are identical only if there are enough semantically similar, psychological connections between P1 and P2. Since belief revision involves adopting a belief at a later time that is not semantically similar to a belief at an earlier time, Gunnarsson points out that on Parfit’s psychological continuity criterion belief revision counts as a "’minus point’ with respect to the identity of fundamental entities" (p. 44). However, he thinks that this is entirely wrongheaded:

When somebody revises her belief, she commits herself to a new belief. She must therefore be the one who has the new belief. This means that belief revision should not be understood as a “minus point” with respect to the identity of fundamental entities. On the contrary: precisely because somebody revises her belief, identity is preserved across the whole process. This brief argument suffices as a refutation of the psychological criterion. (p. 44)

This criticism leads directly to Gunnarsson’s own account of the identity of fundamental entities. Belief revision or commitment anew to the truth of something, e.g., “that the post office closes at 6 p.m.,” establishes an empirical connection between the old and new beliefs and thus diachronic identity rests on an empirical relation (p. 45). However, since the relation of revision of belief or commitment presupposes identity, the diachronic account of identity is circular. All that is necessary for belief revision or belief maintenance is that the person be “minimally responsible” for her beliefs. A person is minimally responsible for a belief if she believes it to be true but could revise her belief, regardless of whether she actively acquired the belief in the first place or whether it is realistic to expect her to change her belief. Gunnarsson’s “Authorial Correlate Theory” thus holds: “I am fundamentally an agent who is a correlate to the psychological relations for which this agent is minimally responsible” (p. 48).

He goes on to argue that this empirical, circular theory satisfies the three conditions of adequacy for the identity of fundamental entities understood as agents capable of revising their beliefs. First, since the person in a coma could express commitments that she had before the coma, if she were to awake, commitment continuity and therefore personal identity holds throughout the coma. Second, the relations of commitment revision and maintenance cannot obtain between the pre-fission person and her successors, since these relations presuppose that the person who originally has the commitment and who can reconsider it at a later time are the same fundamental entity. Thus, by definition, commitment revision or maintenance could not obtain between one fundamental entity and the successors, i.e., two non-identical fundamental entities. Third, in contrast to non-empirical theories, the commitment criterion does justice to the “unity reaction” by acknowledging the possibility that the original person could be identical to only one of the successors, but it denies that this is the case on empirical grounds and considerations of supervenience that the commitment relation cannot exist between only one of the successors and not the other.

Gunnarsson then considers the relationship between the fundamental entity that he is and his body. Is it possible for him to change bodies? Or does commitment continuity entail that the same material being must exist in order for him to exist? Gunnarsson considers Shoemaker’s thought experiments involving “brain-state transfer (BST)” in which the complete states of a person’s brain are transferred to a cloned body and the old body is destroyed. He also considers the film, Multiplicity, in which the main character, Doug, agrees to have himself cloned and in which all of his bodily and psychological characteristics are perfectly copied. Gunnarsson’s intuitions run with the film’s portrayal that Doug is identical with the original human being that continues to exist through the cloning process and not with the cloned copy. However, he also gives a more principled answer to the thought experiments in which he relies on a distinction between making commitments and choosing to have previously made commitments copied. Gunnarsson argues that the former ensures identity but the latter doesn’t. In the former case, because Doug is minimally responsible for his commitments, either because he actively made each commitment or did not get rid of it, the physical basis of the commitment in Doug’s brain is a direct result of something that Doug did. In the latter case, Gunnarsson argues that Doug’s relationship to the copies made of his commitments is entirely different, since he is not responsible for the copying process. “This holds,” Gunnarsson claims, “even if he (Doug) chooses to have them copied and pushes the button that starts the copying process” (p. 64). He concludes that “the continued existence of a material being is necessary for the continued existence of the fundamental entity embodied by that material being” (p. 64).

This is not a very strong argument. It is not clear why we should not say that the physical basis of the beliefs in the cloned body is the direct result of something that Doug did. Indeed, compared to a belief commitment that Doug did not actively acquire but may have passively received and never actively changed, deliberately pushing the button to have his beliefs copied seems to demonstrate more of a commitment to the maintenance of those beliefs than never changing a belief that one has and could change, but never considered changing. I think that a better strategy for Gunnarsson (and for Shoemaker who has argued along similar lines) is to give up the idea that such questions can be answered by appealing to some relations internal to the relations between the mental states or physical states and appeal to some external moral or social considerations that may bear on the determination of personal identity. For example, there might be good moral and social reasons for banning the type of cloning portrayed in Multiplicity and for therefore denying Doug’s identity with his clone, just as there are good moral and social reasons for banning the forging of currency and therefore denying that forged currency is the same as genuine currency. Such an externalist strategy, however, is most likely inconsistent with the “only x or y principle.”

Gunnarsson understands the relation between the person and human being as one of material constitution, analogous to the relation between a particular statue and the material of which it is made. In his view, fundamental entities like you and I come into being when certain living beings acquire agency, i.e., the capacity to make commitments. Gunnarsson does not aim to make any original contribution to an understanding of material constitution, but instead draws on the work of others, particularly, E. J. Lowe, to defend the view against objections raised by Eric Olson. In Gunnarsson and Lowe’s view, persons are distinguished from the living beings that constitute them because they have different conditions of diachronic identity. Whereas personal identity is dependent on the ability to exercise mental functions, the identity of living beings consists of exercising certain life functions that have nothing to do with mentality. According to Gunnarsson, a person was never a fetus and could not exist in a permanent vegetative state, since the diachronic conditions of the identity of a person require mentality. However, not just any type of mentality will do. Gunnarsson refines this notion of mentality by distinguishing “experiences” from “experiences in the strict sense.” An infant lacking the cognitive ability to make commitments may have “experiences.” However, because propositional and conceptual structures are necessary for an experience to serve as a justificatory basis for commitments, an infant cannot have “experiences in the strict sense” - the sense in which an experience can be personal, i.e., that of an “I”. He concludes:

my existence begins with the capacity to have experiences where experiences are understood as something that only a being capable of making commitments can have. There is a clear intuitive sense in which anything that occurs prior to the existence of such an agent cannot count as my experience. (p. 70)

Gunnarsson has reason to reject Olson’s animalism, and “material constitution” well suits his ontological distinction between persons and human organisms. However, it is unclear why he needs to insist that experiences must be structured propositionally in order to serve as a basis for commitments. While the experiences of an infant may not be propositionally structured to serve in a schema of rational justification, they may be sufficiently structured to provide the infant with rudimentary knowledge about the world and interests. For example, a fetus or infant may respond to the sound of a mother’s voice and have an interest in interacting with the mother, even though the infant lacks the conceptual ability to structure experience in propositional and justificatory terms. Such mental experience may entail commitment on the part of the infant in a behavioral and adaptive sense though not in a rational, justificatory sense. Presumably, such conscious experience is had by someone. Indeed, on P. F. Strawson’s account of ownership of experience, such conscious experience attributed to another on the basis of behavioral criteria may be sufficient as a basis for distinguishing my experiences as mine from the other person’s experience as hers. Evidence for attributing conscious experience to someone need not require commitment, in Gunnarsson’s more developed sense, on the part of the individual who has the experience. Indeed, all of us may have cognitively lower-level experiences to which we could never reflectively commit, although we may in fact be committed to them in an adaptive and interested way. They should therefore count as our experiences. Broadening the scope of experiences that may count as personal experiences would not threaten Gunnarsson’s ontological distinction between persons/fundamental entities and human beings, although the time when a person comes into being and stops existing would be altered. For example, I could not exist as an early fetus or as an individual in a permanent vegetative state, but I could exist as a late term fetus with conscious experience or in a minimally conscious state at the end of my life. Diminished mental experience would still be my experience but I could not exist with amentia.

Gunnarsson ends Part II with a discussion of how his authorial correlate theory provides a framework for addressing the various issues raised about personal identity and how it differs from alternative approaches, especially the kind of narrative, self-constitution view offered by Marya Schechtman. In Part III, Gunnarsson then applies his theory to an analysis of multiple personality. In his consideration of Morton Prince’s case of Miss Beauchamp and her personalities, Gunnarsson shows how the authorial correlate theory explains why there is only one fundamental entity in this case. Because belief commitment about, for example, the state of the weather for the day, is continuous through the manifestations of the various personalities of Miss Beauchamp, the various personalities are phases of one and the same fundamental entity. Gunnarsson suggests that while Schechtman’s narrative, self-constitution view might explain why Miss Beauchamp’s personalities are different, the commitment criterion shows why they are personalities of only one fundamental entity. This simple, incisive point is then applied in Gunnarsson’s criticism of alternative theories that would have us think that there is more than one fundamental entity in cases of multiple personality. In particular, Gunnarsson offers strong, detailed criticism of the views of Radden, Dennett, Flanagan, and Rovane. At bottom, Gunnarsson argues that they all ignore how commitment continuity of belief obtains in these cases.

Gunnarsson spends the most time on Rovane. One of his criticisms that focuses on the explanation of project neutral beliefs and judgment is particularly significant, because it shows how Gunnarsson tells a causal story to explain belief commitment. Suppose, Gunnarsson asks, that someone with one personality (e.g., a person in a musician-state) pursues a project on Thursday and happens to notice a café during that time (p. 121). The café is irrelevant to the pursuit of the music project and the cluster of traits associated with being in a music-state. But then suppose that on the following day, when the individual has a different personality, e.g., the person is now in a philosopher-state, the person returns to the café to read Schopenhauer. According to Rovane, if the musician-state and philosopher-state demonstrate distinct unified, rational points of view, there is more than one person in the body. There is no one person that acts on Thursday and Friday. However, Gunnarsson argues that such an interpretation fails to account for how the person who noticed the café on Thursday used the knowledge on Friday. He suggests that Rovane could coherently explain what happens by suggesting that the one person on Thursday can share a token of a type of belief with the person on Friday. However, Gunnarsson points out that this entails a reductio ad absurdum: How can someone obtain a belief on Thursday and then someone who never obtained the belief have it on Friday? Since there is continuity of belief commitment about the existence of the café from Thursday to Friday, Gunnarsson argues that there is only one fundamental entity.

In this criticism, Gunnarsson relies on the relevance of the particular causal history of the belief. One person is responsible for the belief about the café, and having a belief must come through the normal causal process of observation and assent. However, one can come to have beliefs through other causal routes. Although there is no easy explanation of how the philosopher-state person could come to have the belief on Friday, it is not clear why, as noted above, a particular causal route, as in the way Doug’s clone committed to certain beliefs in contrast to how the original remains committed to those beliefs, is so significant. Perhaps the musician-state person conveys this information to the philosopher-state person on some level, somewhat analogous to the way Abigail Hensel (one of two conjoined twins) but not Brittany Hensel (the other conjoined twin) might acquire a belief on Thursday and convey that information to Brittany on Friday.

In chapter 10, Gunnarsson argues against animalism and for the “co-existence thesis,” i.e., the possibility that more than one person can be in a single human body. The simplest case in support of this claim is the case of conjoined twins, such as Abigail and Brittany Hensel, in which there are “two entirely separate sources of passive psychological states, active attitudes, actions, and capacities” (p. 129). However, Gunnarsson does not stop here. He constructs a series of thought experiments in an effort to show how such a complete separation of mental functions could exist in a human body with a single head and even a single brain, but different control centers for mentality. Critical to the thought experiments is the assumption that each of the two fundamental entities must acquire their capacities, active attitudes, and passive mental states for themselves and that there are no causal connections between the capacities, attitudes, and states that each acquires within their common brain. Gunnarsson then observes that in actual cases of multiple personality or dissociative identity disorder, such a complete separation of mental functions does not exist among the multiples, as they demonstrate continuity of belief commitment. Therefore, only one fundamental entity exists in those cases.

Having argued for the possibility of more than one fundamental entity in a single body, Gunnarsson devotes the next chapter to explaining how material constitution can account for the relationship between such fundamental entities and a single human body. There is some interesting discussion of an objection to his view on grounds that it entails a false account of awareness of one’s own body. If the perceiving subject is not something inner and separate from the phenomenal body, as Merleau-Ponty has claimed, how can there be more than one perceiving subject in a single body? Gunnarsson aims to show how his view is consistent with Merleau-Ponty’s view once it is recognized that there can be two entirely separate bodily ways of experiencing the same physical stimulus in a single living being. Gunnarsson also considers an objection of Lynne Rudder Baker that there are bodily limitations that would prevent the expression of more than one person in a body. For example, how can a single body express a relaxed state of one fundamental entity and an agitated state of another fundamental entity at the same time? Gunnarsson argues that the possibility for more than one fundamental entity in a single body assumes that they are never co-active and, that even if they were, bodies could express some, but perhaps not all, conflicting attitudes.

In Chapter 12, Gunnarsson discusses what is involved in the ownership of mental states and proposes a rationalist account in which mental states belong to an individual if the individual is minimally responsible for them through commitments (active states) or could base judgments on passive states, such as perceptions. Because Gunnarsson holds that different individuals (agents) cannot share tokens of passive mental states, any case in which a passive mental state could serve as the basis for a commitment would belong to one fundamental entity. Thus, recalling his earlier criticism of Rovane’s view, the “philosopher-person” on Friday and “musician-person” on Thursday are the same fundamental entity, since both can form commitments from the same token passive experience of noticing the café on Thursday. They may be different personalities but not different persons.

Gunnarsson uses this idea of ownership of mental states to argue that two fundamental entities cannot be linked by memory of passive states or the retaining of psychological capacities and that this leads to acceptance of the following “CAP (mental capacities, active attitudes, and passive states) criterion” as necessary and sufficient for the individuation of fundamental entities:

(1) PY is incapable of having any of the types of CAPs that PX acquires (at odd times) or memories of them unless PY acquires these type of CAPs himself (at even times). (2) PX is incapable of having any of the types of CAPS that PY acquires (at even times) or memories of them, unless PX acquires these types of CAPs himself (at odd times). (3) PY is a fundamental entity existing over time. PX is a fundamental entity existing over time. If (1)(3) are fulfilled, PX and PY are two fundamental entities. (pp. 135-136)

There is some interesting discussion of how this approach to the individuation of fundamental entities differs from that of Sinnott-Armstrong and Stephen Behnke. Also, whereas most theories of personal identity offer a single criterion for the individuation and identity, Gunnarsson’s theory is unusual in that he offers the CAP criterion as a criterion for individuation and commitment continuity as a criterion of diachronic identity.

In the two concluding chapters, Gunnarsson applies his authorial correlate theory to an analysis of multiple personality in therapeutic and biographic discourses (primarily the Beauchamp case and Amongst Ourselves) and literary discourses (primarily The Fight Club). He concludes that these cases are best interpreted as involving multiple personalities in a single fundamental entity but not multiple fundamental entities.

I have tried to provide a relatively detailed account of Gunnarsson’s main arguments, because they are carefully formulated and speak for themselves. His Authorial Correlate Theory deserves serious consideration, as it offers a plausible alternative to abandoning “personal identity” in favor of “survival” as to what matters to us about our identity. Also, any future philosophical discussion of multiple personality will need to come to terms with Gunnarsson’s robust analysis.