Philosophy of Physics: Quantum Theory

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Tim Maudlin, Philosophy of Physics: Quantum Theory, Princeton University Press, 2019, 233pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691183527.

Reviewed by Antonio Vassallo, University of Barcelona


When I was an undergraduate student in physics -- quite a while ago -- there was a running joke in the department that went something like this: quantum theory is the science of preparing systems in one state and detecting them in another state; everything that happens in between is philosophy. Tim Maudlin's book deals exactly with what "happens in between", and it does it with an attitude so direct and iconoclastic that it should have been subtitled "Everything You Always Wanted to Know About Quantum Theory (But Were Afraid to Ask)".

In order to understand where and how Maudlin's introduction to quantum theory breaks with the traditional textbooks on the subject, we should very briefly (and non-rigorously) recall the basic postulates of non-relativistic quantum theory. One of the most comprehensive sources in this regard (Cohen-Tannoudji et al., 1977, chapter III), lists six of them:

  1. At a fixed time t0 the state of a physical system is defined by specifying a normalized vector |ψ(t0)> belonging to the state space H.
  2. Every measurable physical quantity O is described by an operator Ô acting on H; this operator is an observable.
  3. The only possible results of the measurement of a physical quantity O is one of the eigenvalues of the corresponding observable Ô.
  4. The probability P(oi) of obtaining the eigenvalue oi of Ô when the quantity O is measured on a system in the state |ψ> is P(oi)=|<oi |ψ>|2, |oi> being the normalized eigenvector of Ô associated with oi.
  5. If the measurement of on the system with state |ψ> gives the result oi, the state of the system after the measurement "collapses" to |oi>.
  6. The time evolution of the state vector |ψ(t)> is governed by a deterministic, linear equation (i.e., Schrödinger equation).

First of all, Maudlin forcefully denies that these six postulates constitute a physical theory: the most they can provide is a "quantum recipe" for making empirical predictions. The reasons for this denial have to be found in the very strong constraints that he places on what qualifies as a full-fledged theory:

A physical theory should clearly and forthrightly address two fundamental questions: what there is, and what it does. The answer to the first question is provided by the ontology of the theory, and the answer to the second by its dynamics. The ontology should have a sharp mathematical description, and the dynamics should be implemented by precise equations describing how the ontology will, or might, evolve. (xi)

According to Maudlin, this is the kind of theoretical apparatus needed to explain the empirical success of the quantum recipe and to account for the quantum phenomena themselves. The six postulates alone are incapable of doing this, not least because terms like "measurement" and "observable", as they are introduced in this context, lack a satisfactory physical characterization. This is a vivid example of Maudlin's iconoclastic attitude:  certainly, many physicists would strongly disagree with his way of characterizing a physical theory -- especially those with instrumentalist inclinations.

Maudlin's conception of a physical theory motivates another unconventional aspect of the book, namely, the fact that it simply ignores the so-called "Copenhagen interpretation" of quantum theory. Maudlin dismisses this interpretation right away:

There is little agreement about just what this approach to quantum theory postulates to actually exist or how the dynamics can be unambiguously formulated. Nowadays, the term is often used as shorthand for a general instrumentalism that treats the mathematical apparatus of the theory as merely a predictive device, uncommitted to any ontology or dynamics at all. . . . Such an attitude rejects the aspiration to provide a physical theory, as defined above, at all. Hence it is not even in the running for a description of the physical world and what it does. (xi)

At this point, the "subversive" character of Maudlin's book is fully manifest. It is not an introduction to quantum theory in the sense usually intended by physicists, but to quantum theories in the sense put forward by him, i.e., those theoretical frameworks that are able to accommodate the quantum recipe in an ontologically and dynamically clear context. Let's see a bit more in detail how this introduction is carried out.

The book starts by considering eight experimental setups that exhibit non-classical features, namely, the cathode ray tube, the single and double slit experiments (with and without monitoring), the Stern-Gerlach apparatus, the Mach-Zehnder interferometer, and the EPR/GHZ setups. Maudlin's account of the experimental procedures is easy to follow and does not involve any mathematics. Moreover, he does his best to keep the treatment as theory-neutral as possible by reporting just what is observed in these experiments and by being extremely careful when drawing any conclusions from the empirical evidence. In the end, the reader gets a powerful heuristic picture of what physicists mean when they talk of wave/particle duality, quantum interference, uncertainty relations, and quantum non-locality.

Maudlin then proceeds to flesh out the connection between the experiments and the quantum formalism. Here he introduces the technical concepts in a simple and slow paced manner, so that even the reader without any technical background is able to follow completely. Maudlin does not frame the description of a quantum system in terms of its state vector |ψ>, but rather in term of its "wavefunction". A wavefunction is a complex-valued function that, very roughly speaking, represents |ψ> in terms of some appropriately chosen degrees of freedom of the system. Hence, e.g., for a system confined to stay on a straight line, the corresponding wavefunction can be written as ψ(x)=<x|ψ>, |x> being the eigenstates of the 1-dimensional position operator. The description of a system in terms of its wavefunction is physically equivalent to that in terms of its state vector. In particular, postulate 4 is preserved: in the previous example, the probability P(x0) of finding the system at x0 after a position measurement is carried out is P(x0)=|<x0 |ψ>|2=|ψ(x0)|2.

Maudlin thoroughly discusses the notion of the wavefunction as a mathematical object, being careful to separate this concept from that of what he calls "quantum state", that is, the objective physical features of the system that the wavefunction might possibly refer to. The presentation smoothly carries over to the description of how Schrödinger dynamics works, and continues with a self-contained basic treatment of entanglement and decoherence.

After having considered how to assign a wavefunction to a system, and how to evolve such a wavefunction in time (roughly, postulates 1 and 6 above), Maudlin moves to Born's rule (i.e., postulate 4). He emphasizes that nothing in the discussion carried out earlier hints at that: "Born's rule comes out of nowhere, and it injects probabilistic considerations into the physics without warning. Nonetheless, the resulting recipe works with spectacular accuracy." (47)

Maudlin next asks two delicate questions: (i) in what cases is it legitimate to apply Born's rule, and (ii) what are these "measurement outcomes" to which this rule attaches probabilities? He laments the lack of a clear answer to either of the two questions: "as to what, precisely, a 'measurement' is, when one occurs, and what exactly is measured, Born's rule is silent. Such judgments about when to use the rule are left to the discretion of the physicist." (48) His reaction to this puzzle is to side with the physicist John Bell in claiming that the "real" Born's rule applies to outcomes consisting in positions of material bodies in physical space, such as the position of a pointer on a scale. The assumption at work here is that any measurement of whatever physical magnitude in the end produces a reading that is described in terms of a position of something in space. If the predictions obtained by applying Born's rule have to be compared at the end of the day with experimental data couched in terms of positions in physical space, then only the "position version" of this rule is needed. For example, the observable outcome of a spin measurement consists in the occurrence of spots on a screen placed in front of a Stern-Gerlach magnet. Hence, we just need the predictions of the theory to give us a probabilistic distribution for the occurrence of such spots at any given place on screen: invoking a "spin version" of Born's rule in this case would be unnecessary and even confusing. Needless to say, many physicists would frown upon this whole discussion. After all, there is nothing in Born's rule as set out in postulate 4 that hints at position being the "privileged" observable. However, by this point, it should be clear that Maudlin is not touched in the slightest by this objection: in fact, it is based on a characterization of "physical observables" and their "measurement" (postulates 2 and 3) that he rejects as utterly obscure. (68)

Given Maudlin's firm commitment to demote the six postulates to a mere recipe with no explanatory value, the ball is in his court to shed conceptual light on quantum theory. His first step is to dive into the philosophical question par excellence in quantum physics, namely, what does the wavefunction represent? In the literature, two broad types of responses to this question can be recognized. The first, which Maudlin dubs "ψ-ontic", amounts to claiming that the wavefunction represents at least some physical features of the system to which it is associated. This view is contrasted with the "ψ-epistemic" stance, which instead holds that the wavefunction just represents information about the system (e.g., information concerning a statistical ensemble of identical copies of the system, or related to an agent's belief about the system). Maudlin is an advocate of the first approach and, in order to defend this position, he discusses the result of a theorem originally put forward by Pusey, Barrett, and Rudolph (PBR). As they put it, this is a "no-go theorem, which -- modulo assumptions -- shows that models in which the quantum state is interpreted as mere information about an objective physical state of a system cannot reproduce the predictions of quantum theory." (Pusey et al., 2012, 477). This result is hotly debated. Indeed, the defenders of the ψ-epistemic side can challenge PBR's conclusion either by questioning the theorem's underlying assumptions or by coming up with a definition of "ψ-epistemic" that is not touched by it (Y. Ben-Menahem, 2017, goes as far as claiming that the PBR theorem strengthens some versions of the ψ-epistemic approach). Surprisingly enough, Maudlin does not acknowledge any of this controversy, and just accepts that any version of the ψ-epistemic approach is incompatible with the predictions of the quantum recipe (88). This might mislead an inexperienced reader into believing that some sort of consensus has been reached over this matter, whereas this is not the case.

But let's take for granted that the wavefunction represents something that exists out there in the world. What is this "something" (e.g., a property, a substance)? Maudlin's answer will disappoint many metaphysicians, especially those linking their inquiry to science. He, in fact, rejects any attempt to assign the quantum state to pre-established categories of being. This is because "The notion that all existing entities belong in one category or other goes back at least to Aristotle . . .", but "Why think that Aristotle, or any other philosopher or scientist who never considered quantum theory, had developed the right conceptual categories for characterizing everything physically real?" (89) This is fair enough, but it does not automatically follow from this that the quantum state cannot fit into a "standard" metaphysics. Indeed, many philosophers take the issue of finding the right ontological category of the quantum state very seriously (see Myrvold, 2018, section 5.2, for an overview of the major proposals on the table). Maudlin, instead, sees "no virtue in this method of pursuing the question" (89). For him things are crystal clear: "The quantum state is a novel feature of reality on any view, and there is nothing wrong with allowing it a novel category: quantum state." (89) This is another place where Maudlin coveys his views so strongly that he gives the impression that there is not much to debate about that.

The remainder of the book is devoted to the main approaches that qualify as "quantum theories" in Maudlin's view, namely, spontaneous collapse, pilot wave, and many worlds. His presentation of these three approaches is deliberate and fair, and conveys a detailed enough picture of the virtues and vices of each theory.

In particular, Maudlin extensively considers how these theories address two (connected) issues related to the requirements of ontological and dynamical clarity that a quantum theory must satisfy. The first regards the relation between the evolution of the quantum state -- which, for a system with many spatial degrees of freedom, is represented by a wavefunction defined not on physical space but on a higher dimensional configuration space -- and the behavior of material bodies in physical space. This is a pressing issue for Maudlin, given his view that experimental data are always reported in terms of material distributions in physical space. The second is the problem of giving a plain physical sense to the connection between the Schrödinger evolution of the quantum state, which depicts a deterministic diffusion process in configuration space, and the "appearance" of Born's rule as a probability distribution of localized events in space.

As a side note, it is curious that Maudlin spends basically no time considering one of the most debated conceptual problems in quantum theory, the so-called "measurement problem" (which, roughly, originates from the lack of explanation as to why the collapse mechanism "overrides" Schrödinger's evolution upon measurement). In light of the discussion above, this choice has its own motivation: this problem stems from the conceptual obscurity carried by the six postulates, and it dissolves once we move on to a full-fledged theory that provides a clear description of physical interactions (including measurement interactions).

The final part of the book provides a brief sketch of the possible relativistic extensions of the theories previously discussed, including the conceptual challenges that these approaches have to face in order to be made compatible with the structure of Minkowski spacetime.

Maudlin's book is likely to upset many physicists and metaphysicians, but in a positive, thought provoking way. Moreover, its plain presentation style makes it a good introductory book for students and non-specialists. In short, it is highly recommended for anybody interested in quantum theory, and especially in what "happens in between."


Ben-Menahem, Y., The PBR Theorem: Whose Side Is It On?, Studies in the History and Philosophy of Modern Physics 57, 80-88, 2017.

Cohen-Tannoudji, C., Diu, B., and Laloë, F., Quantum Mechanics, Vol. I, John Wiley and Sons, 1977.

Myrvold, W., "Philosophical Issues in Quantum Theory", The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2018 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).

Pusey, M.F., Barrett, J., and Rudolph, T., On the Reality of the Quantum State, Nature Physics 8, 475-478, 2012.