Philosophy of Physics: Space and Time

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Tim Maudlin, Philosophy of Physics: Space and Time, Princeton University Press, 2012, 200pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691143095.

Reviewed by Carolyn Brighouse, Occidental College


This is volume one of a two-volume survey of the philosophy of physics. The second volume of the series addresses foundational questions concerning the contemporary theory of matter, Quantum Mechanics. Here, in volume one, Maudlin is concerned with questions that lie at the foundation of space-time theories: What kinds of entities are presupposed by space-time theories, and what kind of structure do those entities (or the space, time or space-time that they make up) have? He surveys these questions in the context of the physics of Aristotle, through Galileo and Newton, to Special and General Relativity. He guides us through these theories in a way that carefully uncovers what he takes to be the answers to these questions in each context. The book covers a lot of familiar philosophical ground in philosophy of space and time. But it does so in a way that introduces the key background to contemporary debates. Philosophical discussion is threaded carefully and precisely though the presentation of the physics, and the ontological and conceptual commitments of the physics are almost always explicitly unpacked and clarified. Along the way Maudlin presents and develops some of the essential concepts that lie at the foundations of space-time theories required for understanding contemporary debates in the philosophy of space and time: topology, affine structure, metric structure, inertial coordinate systems, and gauge freedom, to name just a few.

There are a number of appropriate audiences for the book: the philosophically inclined physicist or physics student, or the student of philosophy (graduate or upper-level undergraduate) interested in getting a sense of philosophy of physics. As Maudlin points out in his preface, physicists don't always address all foundational questions as rigorously as they should, and the book serves to remedy this situation. Its careful geometric presentation of the fundamental content of Special Relativity in particular will make it an invaluable text for a philosophy of space and time course of any level. And of course it will have appeal to philosophers of physics for the clarity and original insights so characteristic of Maudlin's work. It's a wonderful book and a pleasure to read.

The main focus of chapter one, after some historical preliminaries, is to carefully highlight the geometric structure of space and time presupposed by Newtonian mechanics. After introducing the ideas of topological, affine, and metric structure elegantly through pencil, Euclidean straight-edge, and compass constructions, Maudlin illustrates how just Newton's first law, innovative in virtue of the care with which it characterizes inertial motion as uniform motion in a straight line, carries with it the presumption of absolute space existing through absolute time, itself endowed with the topology, affine structure, and metric of Euclidean three space.

The second chapter describes the ontological presuppositions of Newton's second law, and examines Newton's evidence that space has the geometric structure of Euclidean three-space, E3. A clear discussion of Newton's bucket and globes arguments, and the challenges they pose for relationists who attempt to explain forces in terms of relative rather than absolute motions, is followed by a useful discussion of the relative merits of coordinate representations of space verses geometric characterizations of space in physics. Here Maudlin illustrates the interpretive pitfalls associated with taking R3 as representing Euclidean three-space, despite its advantages for representing dynamical laws algebraically. He has a nice discussion of when a coordinate system is appropriate, and he introduces and explains the notion of a gauge freedom. He ends the chapter with a discussion of the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence illustrating how the symmetries of Euclidean three-space lead Leibniz to worry about Newton's postulation of absolute motion and absolute space. While Maudlin illustrates how the arguments utilizing the Principle of Sufficient Reason are wanting, he argues that the Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles, not defensible as a principle of metaphysics, plays the role of uncovering unobservable physical structure in absolute space and time in the kinematic-shift argument.

In chapter three Maudlin illustrates, with characteristic clarity, how the unobservable structure revealed by the kinematic-shift argument can be avoided in Galilean space-time. The discussion proceeds through the most careful, thorough, and informative introduction of space-time diagrams that exists in the literature. And he uses space-time diagrams to show just how to understand both the geometric (metric, topological and affine) and metaphysical differences between absolute space and time and Galilean space-time. He shows how to understand Newton's laws within the context of this geometric approach, illustrating how the structure of Galilean space-time supports a notion of absolute acceleration without also supporting absolute velocity, and he illustrates how inertial coordinate systems are grounded in the geometry of the space-time.

In the next two chapters Maudlin presents the fundamental content of Special Relativity. While these chapters appear less overtly philosophical than those that precede them, they continue the theme of carefully characterizing the conceptual foundations and explanatory structures of the physical theory. As Maudlin suggests, and his presentation shows, Special Relativity is more perspicuously presented from a geometric point of view than by deriving the Lorentz transformations from the equivalence of inertial frames and the constancy of the speed of light. Doing so allows for a more precise understanding of length contraction, time dilation, and the standard "paradoxes" of Relativity. Maudlin presents the structure of Minkowski space-time by illustrating its topological and affine similarities with Euclidean four-space, E4, and revealing the light-cone structure by defining the space-time interval, the special relativistic analogue of the Euclidean metric. Adding to this just the clock hypothesis, that clocks measure the space-time interval on their trajectories, he deftly explains the Twin "paradox" and points out the errors ubiquitous in common explanations of the phenomenon.

The rest of chapter five is a careful presentation of Special Relativity. Armed with Minkowski space-time, the Clock Hypothesis, and what Maudlin terms the Law of Light (that the trajectory of light in a vacuum from an event, p, is a straight line on the future light-cone of p), and the Relativistic Law of Inertia (that physical objects subject to no forces travel the straight lines of Minkowski space-time and in particular that massive physical objects follow trajectories that are always time-like) he presents the natural conventions for how to construct inertial coordinate systems. He then begins to detail how to understand and avoid very common misconceptions (certainly among physics students, but many others too) about simultaneity, the speed of light, time dilation and length contraction.

This discussion continues in chapter six where Maudlin is concerned with further explicating how to understand and explain the theory's experimental predictions. Here he characterizes ideal clocks and the distinction between abstract and physical Lorentz boosts, using them to illustrate and explain Bell's "paradox": what happens to a thread tied between two initially inertial and relatively at rest rockets when they are both accelerated; does it break or not? The discussion is thoughtful and instructive; Maudlin, in characteristic fashion, explicitly brings to light the explanatory structure and metaphysical presuppositions of the solution. The chapter ends with a discussion of how to understand the constancy of the speed of light. The thorough and very careful presentation of Special Relativity is a pleasure to find, and will be a fantastic resource for students. For those wanting to convert fully to the geometric approach Maudlin provides a series of problems in an appendix.

General Relativity is introduced and discussed in the next chapter, the goal here being to give an accurate flavor of the theory rather than a full presentation. Again Maudlin warns against common misconceptions, here specifically about the relation between General Relativity and its predecessors. His presentation motivates the geometrization of gravity in General Relativity via a discussion of the difference between flat geometry and curved geometries, and a discussion of the weak equivalence principle, that test bodies of different masses fall at the same rate if only subject to the force of gravity, in the context of Newtonian gravitation. Maudlin illustrates how Einstein's dissatisfaction with a Newtonian account of the Weak Equivalence Principle motivated him to get rid of the force of gravity, and stipulate that objects in free fall suffer no forces at all. Maudlin explains just how this move yields both the weak and the strong equivalence principle, and he explains both principles in the context of General Relativity. The presentation of the foundations of the theory continues with a discussion of Einstein's Field Equation, and the senses in which it describes the geometrization of gravity. To further clarify, Maudlin illustrates a black-hole model of the Field Equation using a space-time diagram, explaining the essential similarities between the space-time of General Relativity and that of Special Relativity. There is a very brief discussion of singularities, the Big Bang, and the problems facing the effort to incorporate a quantum-mechanical account of matter into a relativistic setting.  The chapter ends with a nice discussion of the Hole Argument, the argument that purports to show that on the straightforward way of understanding the ontological commitments of space-time theories, General Relativity is to be understood as indeterministic. Maudlin explains the argument, and presents a representative subclass of the array of responses that have been offered to it. Here, as in earlier chapters, the philosophical issues arise naturally out of the interpretive issues posed by the physics in a way that should serve to motivate further thought in both students of physics and of philosophy.

Having spent the bulk of the book articulating the conceptual foundations of space-time theories, and their implications for our conception of space and space-time, Maudlin turns in the last chapter to a discussion of time. He illustrates that absolute time in the context of Newton's original conception is one dimensional, and points to one topological feature that is left undetermined by this fact: whether time has the structure of an interval or of a closed curve. This question is settled by a Newtonian commitment to absolute simultaneity. So in the context of Relativity, Special or General, both the assumption of the one dimensionality and the assumption of the linear structure have to be revisited. Maudlin explains how we have both at least locally in relativity, but illustrates just how much this could underdetermine the global structure of time: the failure of a global consistent distinction between future-directed arrows and past-directed arrows in a non-orientable space, the failure of an interval structure of time, and the introduction of closed time-like curves, CTC's, in a "rolled up" Minkowski space-time. The lesson, according to Maudlin, is that a structure that everywhere looks locally like a possible space-time may not represent a physically possible space-time. While in the relativistic setting we can no longer speak of the entirety of space at a given time, we can recapture something of the spirit of this by insisting that our space-time is globally hyperbolic, that is, that it contain Cauchy surfaces, space-like surfaces that are intersected exactly once by inextendible time-like curves. Imposing such a constraint rules out space-times with CTC's.

Maudlin has a brief but interesting discussion of the key difference between CTC's and Black Holes, arguing that while the latter are imposed on us by the physics, the former are not, and that anyone who believes that time essentially involves an asymmetric ordering of events is free to reject the physical possibility of a space-time with CTC's. As Maudlin points out, the cylindrical quotient spaces of Minkowski space-time are "done by hand" (p. 161) rather than arising from physical conditions. At some level Maudlin's right of course, but a fuller discussion of the distinction here, and just when and why we throw out solutions to Einstein's Field Equations on grounds of unphysicality would be absolutely appropriate given the way the book has developed so far. The chapter continues with an entertaining discussion of the logical (and physical) coherence of time travel, ending with the suggestive claim that "perhaps the nature of time precludes it from going round in a circle." And Maudlin closes with a brief but engaging discussion of the direction of time and time reversibility in space-time theories, but puts the full discussion off until the next volume.

It is hard to think of ways to improve the book. Maudlin has suggestions for further reading, but perhaps there could be more of these (in mathematics, as well as in philosophy and physics), and they could be more systematically indicated at the ends of sections or chapters: interest is piqued so often that more guidance for further reading would serve the intended audience well. Occasionally too one would like further philosophical discussion, knowing that Maudlin could not fail to be illuminating. But the complaint is unreasonable given the intended purposes of the book and of the Princeton Foundations of Contemporary Philosophy series, and the solution is simply to dive into the rich literature within philosophy of space and time for which the book is so excellent a preparation. Maudlin fills a void in the extant literature, giving us a text that stands alone with sufficient clarity and detail both to explain space-time physics and to motivate some of the central philosophical issues in philosophy of space and time.