Philosophy of Pseudoscience: Reconsidering the Demarcation Problem

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Massimo Pigliucci and Maarten Boudry (eds.), Philosophy of Pseudoscience: Reconsidering the Demarcation Problem, University of Chicago Press, 2013, 469pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780226051963.

Reviewed by Martin Curd, Purdue University


The editors offer this collection of twenty-three articles as a contribution to "something of a new philosophical subdiscipline, the Philosophy of Pseudoscience." (p. 2) Philosophy is interpreted broadly to include history and philosophy of science, sociology, psychology, cognitive science, and epistemology (but not what the editors call the "pseudodisciplines" of social constructivism and postmodernism). This eclectic approach is reflected in the titles of the book's six parts: (I) What's the Problem with the Demarcation Problem? (II) History and Sociology of Pseudoscience, (III) The Borderlands between Science and Pseudoscience, (IV) Science and the Supernatural, (V) True Believers and Their Tactics, (VI) The Cognitive Roots of Pseudoscience.

In Part I, several authors evaluate the contributions of Popper and Laudan to the demarcation problem. Predictably, everyone agrees that Popper's criterion of falsifiability (as applied to sentences) is too weak, and that none of Laudan's arguments for rejecting demarcation as a pseudoproblem is sound. Several authors (including Massimo Pigliucci, "The Demarcation Problem") recommend abandoning the search for necessary and sufficient conditions for demarcating science in favor of a cluster concept or family resemblance approach. Sven Ove Hansson ("Defining Pseudoscience and Science") offers a schematic "if and only if" definition of a pseudoscientific statement (revised from his earlier work) as one that (1) although concerning an issue that falls within the domains of science, (2) suffers from such a severe lack of reliability that it cannot at all be trusted, and (3) is part of a doctrine that its main proponents misrepresent as being the most reliable in its area.[1] As Hansson acknowledges, his definition of pseudoscience is "not operational" since it presupposes that we can identify the domains of (genuine) science and flesh out what (epistemic) reliability amounts to.

Maarten Boudry ("Loki's Wager and Laudan's Error") applauds Hansson's definition of pseudoscience for putting the emphasis in the right place: epistemic warrant. Another virtue of Hansson's definition is that it highlights the heterogeneity of pseudosciences and directs our attention to the various stratagems and dodges by which pseudoscientists try to mask their lack of warrant. Several authors in the volume reject the charge (made by Laudan, Quinn, Grünbaum, and others) that, in the context of trying to characterize pseudoscience, it is a fallacy to focus on the behavior of pseudoscientists rather than on the propositions that constitute their theories. A definition such as Hansson's requires us to document such behavior. In any case, it is often difficult to tell what the theory in question amounts to until its vague formulation is made more explicit by its proponents as they try to immunize it from criticism. There is, as Boudry puts it, a "pervasive entanglement" (p. 90-92) between the content of a theory and the moves made by its adherents, a point also made by Frank Cioffi ("Pseudoscience") in Part V.

Boudry also takes Laudan to task for conflating the territorial and the normative problems of demarcation. Boudry sees the Popper of The Logic of Scientific Discovery as addressing primarily the non-normative territorial question, which is the philosophically boring task of drawing a boundary around the domain of science, thus distinguishing it, professionally and institutionally, from other domains such as philosophy, logic, mathematics, metaphysics, theology, etc. Only in Conjectures and Refutations does Popper take on the normative challenge of explaining why science is cognitively reliable (in terms of falsifiability plus corroboration). Contrary to Laudan, the fact that a normative criterion of demarcation (such as Popper's) fails to match the territorial boundaries of science is neither here nor there. Thus another of Laudan's criticisms of the demarcation project fails.

Acknowledging the relevance of the behavior of proponents of a doctrine (in identifying it as either genuine science or its counterfeit) is not the same as explicitly according a social dimension to what science (or its counterfeit) fundamentally is. Martin Mahner ("Science and Pseudoscience"), citing Paul Thagard and Mario Bunge, argues that we need to ascend to entire epistemic fields in order to grasp properly the science/pseudoscience distinction, where "an epistemic field is a group of people and their theories and practices, aimed at gaining knowledge of some sort." (p. 36) While this inclusiveness may have virtues, it is somewhat disconcerting to be told that "knowledge acquired in an epistemic field needs neither be factual nor true" (p. 36), with a footnote referring the reader to Popper. I also had reservations about the merits of Harry Frankfurt's analysis of bullshit as the key to understanding the nature of pseudoscience, advocated by James Ladyman ("Toward a Demarcation of Science from Pseudoscience").

In Part II, Thomas Nickles ("The Problem of Demarcation") surveys approaches to demarcation since Aristotle but focuses mainly on the more recent past. Nickles points out that, when allocating funds to competing projects, it is often easier (i.e., less divisive and more in tune with the needs of science and society) to judge their relative fertility and future promise rather than to stigmatize some of them as unscientific. When it comes to creation science and intelligent design (which are contentious, at least in the U. S.) Nickles sees an important role for "heuristic appraisal" in deciding where to invest society's resources, whether in research or education. Being prospective, heuristic appraisal may appear to differ significantly from Lakatos's retrospective appraisal of the comparative progress of rival research programmes; but of course predictions of future progress rest on past performance, and a track record of zero past progress bodes ill for the future.

Daniel P. Thurs and Ronald L. Numbers ("Science, Pseudoscience, and Science Falsely So-Called") trace the history of the phrase "science falsely so-called" (often employed by critics of Darwinism in the nineteenth century) and the term "pseudoscience" (which, they tell us, lost its hyphen around the turn of the twentieth century). Why did the use of "pseudoscience" increase markedly after 1960? Surely it was not because of the activities of philosophers of science. It resulted largely from a backlash in the U. S. (by Carl Sagan, Paul Kurtz, Michael Shermer, and others) against the spate of best-selling books by Immanuel Velikovsky, Erich von Däniken, Charles Berlitz, and their ilk. Thurs and Numbers do not address the question of why the surge of lucrative pseudoscience coincided with a massive federal investment in scientific research and higher education after World War II.[2]

Erich Goode ("Paranormalism and Pseudoscience as Deviance") gives a sociological account based on two case studies: astrology and parapsychology. His overall conclusion, as far as I can tell, is that "pseudoscientific belief systems are deviant to the extent that their claims are not valorized by mainstream institutions" and "in spite of their popularity among the public at large, the sociologist regards pseudoscientific belief systems as deviant." (p. 162)[3] Noretta Koertge ("Belief Buddies versus Critical Communities") notes that fringe movements, whether of conspiracy theorists or pseudoscientists, often form groups to share information and provide mutual support. These informal "belief buddy" groups almost always lack rigorous criticism, a core feature of scientific associations and peer-reviewed journals. Koertge asks whether introducing such a critical element would improve the quality of marginal or pseudoscientific research. The two cases she examines -- the Society for Scientific Exploration (devoted mainly to paranormal phenomena such as ESP) and the Journal of Condensed Matter Nuclear Science (focusing on "Low-Energy Nuclear Reactions," aka cold fusion) are not particularly encouraging as exemplars of how to achieve scientific legitimacy.

The "borderlands" of Part III are speculative areas of contemporary science that are not yet established or recognized as fully legitimate (and indeed may never be). In his wide-ranging "Science and Pseudoscience," Michael Shermer (a veteran of the war against pseudoscience and attempts by creationists to infiltrate science classrooms) classifies a number of areas (string theory, inflationary cosmology, the search for extraterrestrial intelligence, grand theories of economics, hypnosis, chiropractic, acupuncture, alternative medicine) as borderlands science, distinguishing it from "normal science" on the one hand and pseudoscience on the other. Like Richard Feynman, whom he quotes approvingly, Shermer is confident that the final verdict always must rest with nature (though he recognizes that an investigator's having the right scientific credentials and support system helps enormously).

The borderlands can also include parts of past science before they achieved (or failed to achieve) scientific respectability. As Michael Ruse ("Evolution") explains, it is a salutary antidote to dogmatism in these matters to consider the way in which evolution went from being a pseudoscience (driven by progressivist ideology in the writings of Erasmus Darwin, Lamarck, and Robert Chambers) to being a popular science (after 1859, courtesy of Charles Darwin and the proselytizing of Thomas Huxley), before finally achieving the status of a professional science in the 1930s (with the synthesis of natural selection with Mendelian genetics by Ronald Fisher, J. B. S. Haldane, and Sewall Wright).

Carol E. Cleland and Sheralee Brindell ("Science and the Messy, Uncontrollable World of Nature") defend the legitimacy of field sciences, which have sometimes been attacked as less than respectable because they are confined to observational studies and preclude experiments. On the face of it, this seems a ludicrous accusation (since it would equally condemn observational astronomy). The authors (drawing on Cleland's earlier work) have no difficulty in showing how confirmation of hypotheses can be obtained (in paleontology, for example) by relying on the de facto asymmetry of determination: past events (such as the asteroid collision responsible for the Cretaceous extinction) are grossly overdetermined by their effects. This enables the confirmation of hypotheses that provide "the greatest causal unity to the diverse and puzzling body of traces . . . acquired through field investigations" (p. 195), presumably by inference to the best explanation or the most probable cause.[4]

Part IV, "Science and the Supernatural," contains just two articles. Barbara Forrest ("Navigating the Landscape between Science and Religious Pseudoscience") has been a stalwart defender of biological science against the importunities of creationists and the intelligent design movement. Here she credits Hume with having anticipated some of the insights that underlie modern cognitive psychology, especially in its attempts to explain why humans are predisposed to believe in supernatural religion (and "religious pseudoscience such as creationism"), even while rejecting other "more mundane forms of pseudoscience involving paranormal phenomena" (p. 264) on religious grounds. She cites the theories of Todd Tremlin, Scott Atran, and Pascal Boyer, whose work is discussed further in the papers in Part VI. Here I merely sound a note of caution in placing too much emphasis on the historical Hume. Forrest cites Robert Pennock on Hume's "insight" that "we have no experience and thus no knowledge of divine attributes," from which it is supposed to follow that "we can draw no conclusion about a supernatural designer." (p. 265) It is important to distinguish between concept empiricism and judgment empiricism. Hume endorsed both, but only the latter is consonant with modern empiricism and science. After all, we have no experience (that is, sense experience) of the attributes of subatomic particles but it does not follow that we can draw no conclusion about them. What is needed, and what I think Forrest fails to provide, is a convincing argument for why it is impossible to have scientific knowledge of supernatural entities. Is there something about science (not about judgment empiricism in general) that prevents it?

Evan Fales ("Is a Science of the Supernatural Possible?") addresses this question by distinguishing ontological naturalism (there are no disembodied minds) from methodological naturalism (scientists should eschew appealing to such minds in their explanations). He then argues that any form of methodological naturalism that scientists should adopt will be very weak unless the following ontological claim (which he labels "theism," in scare quotes) can be ruled out: there are disembodied minds that causally interact with material bodies and/or embodied minds. Fales rejects (with a nod to Plantinga) the argument advanced by Pennock and others that if "theism" were true, capricious and widespread spooky interventions would play havoc with our use of scientific instruments and experiments to gain knowledge of the world. But he thinks that there is a good scientific reason to reject any causal interventions by disembodied minds, namely that they would violate the law of the conservation of momentum. In any case, Fales, like many other authors in the book, finds the kind of vaguely characterized supernatural meddling hypothesized by Michael Behe (and other proponents of intelligent design) to be woefully lacking in explanatory value. Also, as Fales aptly remarks, the fact that supernatural stop gaps have invariably been replaced by naturalistic explanations in the past gives us scant reason to expect that the replacement might go in the other direction in the future.

The papers in Part V diagnose and respond to the stratagems pseudoscientists use to promote their views and/or evade relevant criticism. The late Frank Cioffi ("Pseudoscience") deftly exposes the equivocations and methodological flaws in Freud's theory of the alleged sexual causes of neuroses, taking issue with attempts (by Grünbaum and others) to argue that this core part of psychoanalysis is falsifiable. Jesper Jerkert ("Why Alternative Medicine Can Be Scientifically Evaluated") explains why CAM (complementary and alternative medicine) can be fairly tested in controlled trials despite the protests of its advocates. Jean Paul van Bendegem ("Argumentation and Pseudoscience") sketches a general framework for understanding the structure of dialogic exchanges in real-life conditions that differ from the idealizations of formal logic. Donald Prothero ("The Holocaust Denier's Playbook and the Tobacco Smokescreen") inveighs against nefarious attempts to undermine established truths by spreading false doubts. His examples include the campaigns waged by a cabal of free-market ideologues (mostly physicists from the Cold War era) exposed in Naomi Oreskes and Erik M. Conway, Merchants of Doubt: How a Handful of Scientists Obscured the Truth on Issues from Tobacco Smoke to Global Warming (Bloomsbury Press, 2010).

Evolutionary psychology is controversial, with many unresolved disputes about how selection has shaped the human mind, and about which mental features are adaptations and which byproducts. Pigliucci assigns evolutionary psychology to the borderlands region of "proto/quasi-science." (p. 18) Nonetheless, there is a consensus that modern humans share an array of cognitive dispositions that affect how we process information and think about the world. Most cognitive psychologists accept the dual-process theory of reasoning: fast, frugal, intuitive, automatic, and largely unconscious, on the one hand; slow, reflective, mediated by concepts and representations, on the other. In Part VI, Stefaan Blancke and Johan de Smedt ("Evolved to Be Irrational?") argue that components of our "fast and frugal" repertoire can help explain why people are drawn to pseudoscientific beliefs (such as creationism, homeopathy, and acceptance of paranormal phenomena) and find them difficult to relinquish. They single out three such components for special attention: a preference for teleological explanation, essentialism (the assumption that objects, especially living things, have an immutable essence that guides their behavior), and a tendency to populate the world with agents and to interpret their behavior in terms of intentions. Creationism is said to "piggyback" on these inferential "biases" (teleology, essentialism, agentive thinking) in an especially potent way. The authors are careful to point out that they are not trying to debunk pseudoscientific beliefs by appealing to these intuitive tendencies, nor are they arguing that these instinctive preferences are inherently irrational. Their aim, rather, is to explain why pseudoscientific beliefs persist even when there is strong evidence against them.

A more negative appraisal of agentive thinking is evinced by Filip Buekens ("Agentive Thinking and Illusions of Understanding"), who judges the intentional stance to be seductively deceptive in many areas of science and philosophy. Konrad Talmont-Kaminski ("Werewolves in Scientists' Clothing") focuses on Robert McCauley's thesis that science relates to pseudoscience in roughly the same way that theology relates to popular religion. Despite their mildly counterintuitive features, humans are drawn to popular religion and pseudoscience because of the prominence they accord to intentional agents. As such, popular religion and pseudoscience are judged to be byproducts of the same intuitive "fast and frugal" cognitive mechanism. Science and theology, by contrast, are radically counterintuitive, require long chains of reasoning, and are remote from commonsense and everyday experience. A problem for this account, one that Talmont-Kaminski considers at length, is posed by pseudosciences (e.g., Velikovsky's catastrophism, biorhythms, astrology, cold fusion, etc.) in which agents play no explanatory role. Surely, in the Velikovsky case, the fault lies at the reflective level: Velikovsky perversely disregards well-founded science whenever it conflicts with his interpretation of ancient texts and stories.

Velikovsky may be the kind of case that Nicholas Shackel ("Pseudoscience and Idiosyncratic Theories of Rational Belief") has in mind: the pseudoscientist who is not completely beyond the pale of rationality but weights things in an idiosyncratic way when deciding what to believe. Shackel argues against strict evidentialism (the view defended by Richard Feldman and Earl Conee) as an account of what we ought to believe in favor of according a role for what he calls ethical values ("things constitutive of a worthwhile life") in rational belief formation. The problem for such a broadly pragmatic approach, of course, is figuring out which values and convictions are legitimate, and which not. In fairness to Shackel, he does conclude by conceding that, while he thinks he has shown that strict evidentialism is false, "evidentialist practice is right for the most part." (p. 435)

Finally, in Part VI, John S. Wilkins ("The Salem Region") takes as his starting point Bruce Salem's hypothesis that an engineering background predisposes one to adopt creationist/ID viewpoints. Wilkins expands on this by classifying "modes of belief formation" in a "phase space" in which the Salem region is occupied by those who are essentialists, late adopters (distrustful of novelty), "deductivists" (rather than "inductivists"), and prone to authority bias (where the authorities are often one's first teachers or religious leaders, rather than contemporary scientific experts). This psychological profile seems too broad and vague to advance our understanding of pseudoscience (though philosophers may think it fits some of their colleagues).

In Gary Larson's cartoon "Scientist Hell," a smirking devil ushers an apprehensive man (beard, spectacles, white lab coat) into a room of nattering enthusiasts. The sign on the door reads, "Psychics, Astrologists & Mediums Eternal Discussion Group." If a similar room awaits philosophers, the present volume might come in handy.

[1] In earlier versions, Hansson used "warrant" instead of "reliability;" clause (3) was worded to include doctrines whose proponents are not claiming that they are sciences.  See Sven Ove Hansson, "Cutting the Gordian Knot of Demarcation," International Studies in the Philosophy of Science 23 (October 2009) 237-43.

[2] Michael Gordin, The Pseudoscience Wars: Immanuel Velikovsky and the Birth of the Modern Fringe (University of Chicago Press, 2012) traces it, in part, to Cold War paranoia.

[3] I lost patience with this article upon reading that "Isaac Newton…. was a firm believer in the validity of astrology" (p. 151), that "In 1947 the US Congress passed the Fourteenth Amendment" (p. 148), and that "Physicists make use of material forces such as velocity, mass, friction, gravity, and heat" (p. 156).

[4] One minor quibble concerns the authors' discussion of the problem of induction: their definition of "grue" (unlike Goodman's) is conjunctive, not disjunctive. This threatens to reduce the new riddle to the old Humean problem if what is at stake is the possibility that emeralds (hitherto observed as green) might change their color in the future.