Philosophy of Quantum Information and Entanglement

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Alisa Bokulich and Gregg Jaeger (eds.), Philosophy of Quantum Information and Entanglement, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 277pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521898768.

Reviewed by Travis Norsen, Marlboro College


This collection of essays, edited by Alisa Bokulich and Gregg Jaeger of Boston University, features contributions from leading experts in the philosophy and foundations of quantum physics. The included papers explore and develop three basic (and often overlapping) questions: (i) what quantum mechanics (QM) implies for the burgeoning field of information science, (ii) how information theoretic approaches might lead to a deeper understanding of the nature and implications of QM, and (iii) how operationalist perspectives inspired by information theory might suggest new paths forward in physics.

Let me begin by explaining, for those not already familiar, the two ideas -- "quantum information" and "entanglement" -- the collection is about.

In its primary sense, "information" is what somebody knows about something (usually in a context where this knowledge is limited or incomplete). In physics, though, one typically considers information from the perspective of its embodiment in some physical system. For example, the data stored on your computer's hard drive is encoded in a long string of tiny magnets, each oriented with its north pole either "up" or "down"; the string can be represented mathematically as a sequence of 1s and 0s, each such BInary digiT constituting one "bit" of information.

In classical physics, a two-state system (like one of the tiny magnets on the hard drive) is, by definition, always in one of the two possible states. According to QM, however, the state space is more complicated: complex linear combinations (i.e., superpositions) of the two states are also possible. The amount of information required to specify the precise quantum state of such a two-state system -- the "qubit" -- is hence taken as the quantum analog of the "bit", i.e., the basic unit of measure for quantum information. A basic fact of quantum information theory is that an infinite amount of classical information would be required to specify the quantum state of a two-state system: a single qubit of information is equal to an infinite number of bits of information! However, the quantum state of a two-state system cannot be measured. Instead, the outcome of a measurement is always one of the two classical states. So despite in some sense containing an infinite information potential, only a single bit of information can actually be extracted from a qubit.

This remarkable situation has given rise to the idea of quantum computers, which would replace the classical two-state systems of classical computers with quantum two-state systems. The relative complexity of the quantum mechanical state space would give such a device extraordinary information processing power. Given the restrictions of measurement, however, significant cleverness is required to design algorithms which would allow the desired results to actually be output -- i.e., to become genuine information (in the primary sense).

The quantum mechanical possibility of superposing classically-allowed states is at the bottom of "entanglement", too. Consider, for example, two spatially-separated two-state systems (call them "particles"). Classically, there are four possible states: both particles are "up" (11), both are "down" (00), the left particle is "up" and the right is "down" (10), and the left particle is "down" and the right is "up" (01). We have already seen that, quantum mechanically, the individual particles need not be "up" or "down" but can be in a superposition of "up" and "down". One might expect, then, that the situation with two particles is this: the particle on the left is in one of its quantum mechanically allowed states, and the particle on the right is in one of its quantum mechanically allowed states. This situation, a so-called "product state", is however only a very special case. The more general quantum mechanically allowed state for the two-particle system is in fact an arbitrary superposition of the four classically allowed states mentioned above. For example, the quantum state of the two-particle system might be a superposition of the (11) and (00) states. This is an example of an "entangled" state. It is evidently a state in which neither particle individually is "up" or "down", but in which, nevertheless, both particles are definitely oriented in the same direction. Furthermore, according to the rules of QM, a measurement performed on one of the particles will cause it to (non-deterministically) reveal itself as either "up" or "down" -- at which point the unmeasured distant particle will also, simultaneously, acquire a definite (and, in this example, perfectly correlated) orientation.

These puzzling features of quantum theory were first noticed and explored by especially Einstein and Schrödinger in the 1930s. Schrödinger (1935, 1936) coined the term "entanglement" to describe this kind of situation, and Einstein (along with co-authors Podolsky and Rosen, 1935) famously pointed out that the "spooky action at a distance" associated with measurement on entangled states seemed to reveal a conflict between quantum theory (as it was understood especially by Niels Bohr) and special relativity's prohibition on faster-than-light causal influences. EPR considered this a serious objection to quantum theory and suggested that one might find alternative theories (of the type now called "hidden variable theories") which were compatible with relativity. Largely because most physicists (erroneously) took Bohr's reply to have refuted the arguments made by EPR, the issue was mostly ignored for several decades, until J.S. Bell proved in 1964 that the "non-locality" EPR had shown to be a feature of orthodox quantum theory was not an idiosyncratic feature of that particular theory (a feature that might be absent in some empirically equivalent alternative) but was instead a necessary feature of any theory making the same empirical predictions as QM.

By the early 1980s, it was becoming clear that the relevant empirical predictions were correct and it was not long before physicists started to take entanglement and quantum non-locality seriously, as really-existing resources to be explored and developed. The result has been an explosion of interest in entanglement, quantum information, and quantum computation in the last two decades.

The above sketch is meant to provide a basic sense of the questions and developments which form the foundation for the contributions in this volume. It may also serve as a useful litmus test for preparedness for the volume: most of the contributions are highly technical and presuppose not only a strong mastery of the issues sketched above, but also some familiarity with quantum theory and some prior exposure to the literature on information theory, quantum computing, and/or Bell's theorem. The accessibility of the papers, though, is increased by the editors' 18-page Introduction. This presents a technically careful and nicely essentialized overview of the ideas I have merely sketched above and then helpfully surveys the "central developments in this field 'beyond Bell'." (p. xii) These developments include attempts to quantify and distinguish entanglement and quantum non-locality as well as important advances in quantum information theory, quantum computing and cryptography, and the project of understanding quantum theory as being fundamentally about information.

In this short review, it is impossible to give anything like a complete description of (let alone careful assessment of) the twelve contributed essays. Here I will mention just a few and indicate their contents by way of giving the flavor, breadth, and level of the collection.

In a paper entitled "Entanglement and subsystems, entanglement beyond subsystems, and all that" Lorenza Viola and Howard Barnum systematically develop a proposal for a more generalized conception of entanglement which, for example, does not presuppose any particular decomposition of a system into subsystems (the way my example above presupposed that the two-particle system should be understood as comprising the particle on the left and the particle on the right). Instead, Viola and Barnum "generalize the characterization of pure-state entanglement as relative mixedness under restricted capabilities" (p. 22) -- an approach which, they acknowledge, "shares some of its motivations with the recently proposed approach of relational quantum mechanics" (p. 40). Their presentation of Generalized Entanglement is clear and mathematically rigorous, and includes helpful examples and also an interesting discussion of remaining open questions.

Another notable contribution is the paper "Formalism locality in quantum theory and quantum gravity" by Lucien Hardy. Motivated by the idea that a viable quantum theory of gravity will fail to possess a definite causal structure (because the space-time structure itself will exhibit quantum fluctuations and uncertainty), Hardy introduces the concept of "formalism locality" -- the requirement that "in making predictions for [an arbitrary space-time region], we refer only to mathematical objects pertaining to [that region]" (p. 49). He then goes on to systematically develop the so-called "causaloid" framework -- a mathematical structure that allows a re-formulation of ordinary quantum theory, but also exhibits formalism locality and, the author cogently argues, may therefore be especially suitable in the formulation of candidate quantum theories of gravity.

Several contributions -- including "Probabilistic theories: What is special about Quantum Mechanics?" by Giacomo Mauro D'Ariano and "Bayesian updating and information gain in quantum measurements" by Leah Henderson -- explore questions about the nature and role of quantum probabilities. D'Ariano's essay works toward a novel axiomatization of quantum mechanics from an operationalist framework. The goal here is to situate quantum mechanics as a special case of a more general category of theories, so as to reveal by comparison what is unique about QM. Henderson's essay reviews and assesses recent proposals by especially Jeffrey Bub and Chris Fuchs to understand QM's collapse postulate as a Bayesian updating of information and the associated background program of understanding QM to be, at bottom, a theory about information (in, again, the primary sense).

Further contributions of considerable interest include "From physics to information theory and back" by Wayne Myrvold, "Non-locality beyond quantum mechanics" by Sandu Popescu, and "Quantum computation: Where does the speed-up come from?" by Bub.

A couple of the papers include some material of dubious veracity and/or relevance, and a few have a tendency to obscure important points (or bury confusions) beneath unnecessary formalism. In general, however, the collected papers are of very high quality and will give interested readers a solid exposure to the cutting edge of research at this boundary between philosophy, physics, and information science.

It should be understood, though, that the research program represented in this volume has competitors which approach the questions at issue in different ways -- or even dispute what questions should be at issue. It is of course hard to accurately summarize the shared philosophical viewpoint of twelve differently-authored papers. But in general one will find here a more operationalist/instrumentalist perspective on physical theories, an undercurrent of sympathy with the orthodox claims (largely refuted by the existence of the alternative de Broglie-Bohm theory) that QM necessitates the abandonment of microscopic determinism and/or realism, and a tendency to regard the standard formulation of QM as sacrosanct with the open interpretive projects allegedly consisting merely in more carefully cataloging its features (as if showing that something was inherent in the quantum formalism represented the end, rather than the beginning, of an attempt to actually understand it).

One might summarize the situation this way. The volume purports to bring readers up-to-date on the important developments in the philosophical foundations of physics (and its implications for information theory) "beyond Bell." (p. xii) But the field divides between (at least) two opposing views of what moving "beyond Bell" ought to consist in. For Bell was, unquestionably, a realist to the core. Recall, for example, that "information" was on his list of "words which, however legitimate and necessary in application, have no place in a formulation [of a theory] with any pretension to physical precision." (Bell, p. 215) And his attitude toward the program of interpreting quantum theory as being fundamentally about information is clear from his (non-rhetorical) questions: "Information? Whose information? Information about what?" (Ibid.) People who think that moving "beyond Bell" must involve fully assimilating his insights -- for example, the recognition of the validity of the EPR argument and its relation to Bell's "locality inequality" (Bell, p. 88), the insistence that a serious formulation of QM shouldn't include vaguely-defined and anthropocentric concepts such as "information", and the general attitude that the operationalist philosophy of QM's founding fathers is a barrier to (not the means to) quantum clarity -- will find some aspects of the book frustrating.

Importantly, though, such people will also find some things to cheer in the book -- notably (though by no means exclusively) the essay by Christopher Timpson ("Information, immaterialism, instrumentalism: Old and new in quantum information"). Timpson analyzes the information theoretic perspective on QM and argues (compellingly to me) that the whole viewpoint is afflicted by an inescapable dichotomy: "It would seem either tacitly to invoke hidden variables, or to slide into a form of instrumentalism." (p. 210)

So, while the volume as a whole is slanted toward a certain (controversial) philosophical viewpoint, it has the virtue of wearing this bias on its sleeve where it can be identified, discussed, and assessed on the merits of the research it inspires. This is of course just how it should be. Furthermore, as pointed out for example in the essay by Hardy (echoing a point more often associated with Einstein): "In adopting [an operational] approach we do not commit ourselves to operationalism as a fundamental philosophical outlook on the world." (p. 47) And it should be noted, too, that, no matter how skeptical one is, for example, of a subjectivist Bayesian reading of QM, it remains clear and undeniable that the information theoretic perspective on QM has led to tremendously important developments (e.g., in quantum computing and cryptography) which have, at least, incredible practical potential. Ignoring these developments would be a serious mistake, even for the most committed quantum realist.

In the end, then, this volume has much to recommend it. Those who agree with its dominant philosophical perspectives will find a diverse set of rich and stimulating papers, representative of the best cutting-edge research in this exciting interdisciplinary program. Those who disagree will still learn about the kinds of research the information theoretic perspective is stimulating and will in addition be encouraged to confront an eminently worthwhile question: how can one understand all of this important progress from a more realist point of view? It is thus easy to stand behind the hope, expressed by Bokulich and Jaeger at the close of their Introduction,

that this volume will provide a useful starting point for those entering this new interdisciplinary field, and will encourage more philosophers and physicists to enter into the dialogue on the exciting philosophical implications of quantum information research. (p. xxviii)



Bell, J.S., Speakable and Unspeakable in Quantum Mechanics, Second Ed., Cambridge University Press, 2004.

Einstein, A., B. Podolsky, and N. Rosen, "Can Quantum-Mechanical Description of Physical Reality be Considered Complete?" Physical Review, Vol. 47, 777-780 (1935).

Schroedinger, E., "Discussion of Probability Relations Between Separated Systems," Proceedings of the Cambridge Philosophical Society, Vol. 31, 555-563 (1935) and Vol. 32, 446-451 (1936).