Philosophy of Religion in the Classical American Tradition

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J. Caleb Clanton, Philosophy of Religion in the Classical American Tradition, University of Tennessee Press, 2016, 295pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781621902102.

Reviewed by Richard Kenneth Atkins, Boston College


This volume is a collection of loosely related essays. Its title captures the only themes they share. They are all on issues related to the philosophy of religion and on philosophers belonging to the classical American tradition: Charles S. Peirce on the reality of God; William James on mystical experience; Josiah Royce on the problem of evil; George Santayana on prayer; John Dewey and Edward Scribner Ames on religious naturalism; and Richard Rorty and Cornel West on the role of religion in public deliberation.

One of J. Caleb Clanton's hopes is to show that these philosophers have something to contribute to debates in the philosophy of religion: "my hope is that this book can get some real philosophical work out of the classical American tradition" (16). Clanton seems to think that the work to be got out of the tradition is largely negative, since his essays mainly show us how fallacious their arguments are. The argument of Peirce's "A Neglected Argument for the Reality of God" is a miserable failure. Fortunately, Clanton argues, Peirce can be used to offer us a "partial defense" of William Rowe's version of the cosmological argument. Royce's solution to the problem of evil disappoints, but a sort of skeptical theism in the vein of William Alston's--but supposedly originally articulated in the book of Job--is plausible. Santayana's arguments against the material efficacy of petitionary prayer fall short. The naturalized religious views of Dewey and Scribner are objectionable. Neither Rorty nor West offers us a satisfactory account of how religious commitments should inform and influence democratic debate. The only philosopher who comes out relatively unscathed is James, and that is only if we interpret his argument for the mystic justifiably believing in God on grounds articulated in "The Will to Believe." In short, if your idea of an evening's entertainment is to have arguments of philosophers in the classical American tradition propped up only to be knocked down and then, occasionally, supplanted with better arguments from contemporary philosophers, this book is for you.

Clanton is an admirably clear writer. He patently desires to give each of these philosophers his due. He endeavors to state their arguments straightforwardly and charitably. His attention to the secondary literature is remarkable. He admits when the arguments are not clear, when claims have not been sufficiently supported, when there is room for doubt and disagreement. While I disagree with Clanton on several issues, I have nothing but admiration for his effort, fairness, and humility in engaging these philosophers of the classical American tradition.

Chapter One is an introduction. In Chapter Two, Clanton engages Peirce to examine whether God is real. The chapter is an amalgam of two of Clanton's previously published essays. One is on Peirce's article "A Neglected Argument for the Reality of God," which Peirce published in 1908; the other uses Peirce's "The First Rule of Logic," a lecture delivered in 1898, to support William Rowe's version of the cosmological argument. Clanton entertains two readings of Peirce's "A Neglected Argument." The first is that Peirce aims to prove the reality of God. Read in that way, the argument is a lamentable failure, and on that Clanton and I (and many other commentators) agree. The second is that Peirce aims to show that belief in God is warranted. I believe that is the right way to read Peirce's article but that Clanton gets the argument wrong (for an alternative construction, see Atkins 2016, Chapter Three).

Clanton presents Peirce as offering two arguments for warranted belief in God. The first is that what convinces a normal person "is probably sound reasoning," and since certain lines of thought convince normal people God is real, those lines of thought are probably sound reasonings. Since they are probably sound reasonings, those people are warranted in believing God is real. But Peirce actually claims that theologians make use of the principle that what convinces a normal person must be presumed sound reasoning. While Peirce, I think, holds this principle is roughly accurate, he also believes that our instinctual lines of thought are in dire need of improvement. Also, to claim that a line of thought may be presumed to be a sound reasoning is not to claim it is probably a sound reasoning, and surely mere presumption in favor of the soundness of a reasoning does not suffice for warrant.

The second argument is that certain lines of thought that lead to belief in God are abductive in nature. Since abduction is reliable, those lines of thought are probably reliable, and so we are warranted to believe in God. But Clanton uses 'reliable' here in a peculiar sense, viz., as "giv[ing] us a pro tanto reason to think a hypothesis is true" (41). But that is not Peirce's view of abduction. He thinks that abduction at best gives us a reason to suspect a hypothesis is true. Also, Peirce does not think abduction is reliable in the usual sense of 'reliable,' as, roughly, typically being truth conducive in a wide variety of normally encountered contexts. What Peirce claims is that abduction is not overwhelmingly wrong, so that after about 20 guesses (rather than, say, a million) we hit upon the correct answer.

In the second part of Chapter Two, Clanton endeavors to use Peirce's maxim "Do Not Block the Way of Inquiry" to argue that it is reasonable for us to conclude that there is some Self-Existent Being whose existence explains the set of Dependent Beings. Peirce would be aghast at the maxim being used in this way for at least two reasons. First, the maxim itself is a corollary of the first rule of logic, which is "that in order to learn you must desire to learn and in so desiring not be satisfied with what you already incline to think" (Peirce 48). Accordingly, Peirce's maxim properly applied is that if one is already inclined to think there is a Self-Existent Being, one should be dissatisfied with that opinion. And similarly, for those who disbelieve there is a Self-Existent Being, they should not be satisfied with that belief but, as Peirce writes, be penetrated with a sense of the unsatisfactoriness of their present condition of knowledge. Second, Peirce himself offers us a cosmology according to which the universe is evolving from a chaotic and indeterminate state to one of greater orderliness, and this cosmology does not require a God, at least as God is traditionally conceived, partly because Peirce thinks such an appeal would not be a sound scientific explanation.

Chapter Three is an examination of James's claims in The Varieties of Religious Experience that mystical states have the right to be "authoritative" over those who have them, that others are not obliged to accept those revelations uncritically, and that mystical experiences "break down" the "authority" of non-mystical consciousness. Various attempts by James's commentators to support this line of thought fail. In an attempt to aid James's case, Clanton proposes that belief in what is revealed in a mystical experience might be licensed by James's doctrine of the will to believe. I concur that this probably gives us the best reading of James's argument, but then his conclusions depend on James's will to believe doctrine. I have serious doubts about that doctrine -- as well as Clanton's use of Richard Gale's reconstruction of the argument rather than Michael Slater's -- and would refer the interested reader to Scott F. Aikin (2016) for a good critical examination.

Chapter Four is on Royce's idealistic solution to the problem of evil. On Royce's view, all of reality is a part of the Absolute. If that is so, then evil and our experiences of it are a logically necessary means to the perfection of the Absolute. I doubt many people today would find this line of thought compelling, and Clanton does not either. After criticizing Royce, Clanton states that he favors a skeptical theist response to the problem of evil, viz., that we are not in the right epistemic position to assert that God is blameworthy for evil and suffering. Clanton's main aim is to show that this solution can be found in the book of Job. But there are two separate issues to consider when reflecting on the book of Job: (1) the statements attributed to Job and to God and (2) the aim of the authors and editors of the book. While a sort of skeptical theism might be read into the statements attributed to Job and to God, it is another question whether the authors and the editors were proposing that solution. Their primary target, in my judgment, was the widespread belief that one suffers only if one has offended God or contravened one's duties. Job is a counterexample to that thesis: he is a pious man who has performed his duties. This raises the question of why Job undeservedly suffers, and the authors and editors of Job seem to have no good answer to that question. Instead, they resort to different devices to resolve the problem. The suffering of Job is really a consequence of the Accuser afflicting him (though this raises its own problems), the young Elihu endeavors to mediate between Job and his friends, and God appears in a whirlwind to chastise Job. Nonetheless, ultimately, Job does not deny that he is suffering undeservedly (after all, he is!) but drops his case (the legal, not epistemic, context is important here). Job does not know why he suffers. God does not give him an answer. Since there is no higher court of appeal than God's, there is simply no further recourse to be had.

Chapter Five is an examination of Santayana's critique of petitionary prayer. Clanton identifies the target of Santayana's arguments as the thesis that "petitionary prayer can cause God to actualize a material state of affairs that would not have otherwise obtained had the petition for it not been made" (129). Clanton states that by 'cause' he means "something on the order of expressing influence, and not force" (253), but I am not sure what he means by this unless, perhaps, he means to underscore that he does not think our prayers can force God to do anything. The thesis is to be distinguished from the claim that prayer can bring about "subjective benefits," such as tolerance, calm, or compassion, a claim Santayana would endorse in spite of his atheism. Clanton does not countenance the possibility that God actualizes material states of affairs but only indirectly through the subjective benefits accrued. For instance, one might pray to God to help the needy and in praying become inflamed with a love for God. That love for God might compel the person praying to then go out and help the needy. Arguably, the prayer has caused God to indirectly actualize a material state of affairs that would not have otherwise obtained.

Clanton notes that Santayana has two arguments against prayer. The first is that we find no correlation between petitionary prayer and the actualization of the states of affairs requested. This is a well-worn argument that pre-dates Santayana's statement of it. Clanton acknowledges that empirical studies have now been done to ascertain whether prayer is materially efficacious but holds that the evidence is inconclusive.

The second argument is that if God is omniscient and omnibenevolent then our prayers would not affect God's actions since God will already know and do what is best. Clanton presents Santayana's argument but then transitions to another statement of it from Eleonore Stump, a statement he regards as more perspicacious. His main target in the argument is the premise that "it is never logically necessary for an omniscient, omnipotent, perfectly good being to make the world worse than it would otherwise be" (139). In responding to the argument, he proposes that "we can imagine a variety of reasons why a supremely good, omniscient, and omnipotent being would not always actualize the best possible state of affairs logically available to it at a particular moment, especially if doing so were logically necessary to achieve a greater good in due course" (145). Very well, but if God is doing it to achieve a greater good, then God is not making the world worse than it would otherwise be. And if there is some other reason why God might forgo the best possible state of affairs, Clanton's imagination fails him.

Chapter Six, on Ames's and Dewey's attempts to naturalize religion, is primarily a statement of Ames's conception of God and how it influenced Dewey's views in A Common Faith. On both of their accounts, God should be regarded not as a supernatural being but as the "ideal end" of a community. God, then, is that to which some group is devoted and for which its members are willing to endeavor mightily and make sacrifices. As Clanton notes, "for Ames, we need to reinterpret religious faith in a way that minimizes metaphysical doctrines and highlights practical effects" (167). Clanton objects on the grounds that Ames and Dewey "highjack" terms such as 'religion' and 'God' and then "hollow them out to the point at which they are no longer recognizable" (172). He further claims that in doing this, religious language is rendered "pragmatically impotent" and may be used for unethical manipulation of other people. I am not convinced that these are great objections. Perhaps there is nothing wrong with the unscholarly person in the pew, Thomas Aquinas, and Ames all having different conceptions of God (as they surely do) provided they are all committed to the same ethical ends (which will mitigate the worry about unethical manipulation) and motivated to attain them (which would suggest that the religious language is still pragmatically potent).

Finally, Chapter Seven turns to questions of how religious commitments might influence democratic discourse. Clanton argues against Rorty's view that appeal to religious commitments in public deliberation is a conversation stopper and that therefore such appeals ought not to be made. One of Clanton's lines of objection to this idea is that Rorty relies on the suppressed premise that "conversational impasses in public deliberation should be avoided." Clanton holds that sometimes impasses are not bad and other times conversations need to be stopped. These claims, though, might suggest that he is not so opposed to blocking the way of inquiry as he had claimed in Chapter Two. Clanton is critical of West's prophetic pragmatism on grounds similar to his objection to Ames and Dewey: it requires "retooling" our religious language, to which Clanton is opposed.


Scott F. Aikin, Evidentialism and the Will to Believe, Bloomsbury, 2016.

Richard Kenneth Atkins, Peirce and the Conduct of Life: Sentiment and Instinct in Ethics and Religion, Cambridge University Press, 2016.

Charles Sanders Peirce, The Essential Peirce, Volume 2, Ed. Peirce Edition Project, Indiana University Press, 1998.