Philosophy of Social Practices: A Collective Acceptance View

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Tuomela, Raimo, Philosophy of Social Practices: A Collective Acceptance View, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 286pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521818605.

Reviewed by Seumas Miller, Australian National University


This is Raimo Tuomela’s most recent book, and it continues the general intellectual project he has pursued in his earlier works, such as the The Importance of Us (Stanford UP, 1995). Roughly speaking, that project is one of providing philosophical analyses of various basic social action concepts, including joint action and collective intentionality, and using these to provide accounts of less basic social notions such as social institutions. Joint actions are actions involving a number of agents performing interdependent actions in the service of some common intention or goal (e.g. two people dancing together or a team of bricklayers and labourers building a wall). Such intentions or goals are referred to as collective or we-intentions since they are in some sense shared and interdependent. We-intentions - together with mutual beliefs (e.g. we all believe that p, we believe that we all believe that p, and we believe that we all believe that we all believe that p) - constitute the core of what is usually referred to by the term, “collective intentionality”.

The analysis of social action concepts is an important new area in philosophy; twentieth century philosophy of action having been largely restricted to the analysis of individual action, and twentieth century philosophy of social science to theorising in relation to social explanation and the ontology of social entities. Other books in this emerging field are Margaret Gilbert’s Social Facts (Routledge, 1989), John Searle’s The Construction of Social Reality (Penguin, 1995), Christopher Kutz’s Complicity (CUP, 2000) and Seumas Miller’s Social Action: A Teleological Account (CUP, 2001). While many of these works offer closely related analyses of central concepts such as joint action and we-intention, and of social phenomena such as social norms and social institutions, there are some notable differences in the various analyses on offer, and some of these are on display in Tuomela’s new book. One of the main theoretical differences is between those who seek to reduce social action concepts such as we-intentions to individual action concepts such as shared individual intentions, and those who resist such reductions, opting to regard we-intentions as ’rock bottom’ or sui generis concepts. Gilbert and Searle belong to the latter camp, Kutz and Miller belong to the former. Although this is not everywhere obvious, I believe Tuomela ultimately embraces the anti-reductionist camp. Here, as elsewhere in disputes about reductionism, the outcome depends on the adequacy of specific proposed reductions. (See Kutz’s Complicity and Miller’s Social Action.)

Another important theoretical difference is between constructivist accounts of sociality and what can loosely be termed realist accounts. Tuomela sides with Searle in being a constructivist. An important general argument against constructivist accounts is that they emasculate central moral notions such as that of right and duty. It turns out that human rights and correlative moral duties, for example, can exist only by virtue of collective acceptance of specific practices. Accordingly, in morally degenerate societies in which human rights are never respected, we must conclude that there simply are no human rights to be respected; for we have no external moral standpoint from which to make moral judgements in relation to collectively accepted social practices. This is in my view deeply problematic.

The main social action concept analysed and deployed in this book is what Tuomela calls “social practices”, and he offers his collective acceptance view of social practices. Moreover, it turns out that social practices are fundamental building blocks of macro-social forms, notably social institutions.

Tuomela understands social practices to be recurrent collective actions performed for shared social reasons (Chapter 4). As Tuomela is aware, this is a wide and amorphous set of social actions, and includes conventional actions such as using a fork to eat, fashions such as wearing jeans, and socially accepted techniques such as the practice of rote learning in schools. Indeed, Tuomela offers a detailed taxonomy of social forms in this area. However, Tuomela’s analytical account of the core notion of a social practice is essentially that of a repeated joint action, or at least an action that each of a number of persons repetitively perform, and an action repetitively performed by each on the basis of a shared we-attitude. This is similar to the analysis of a convention offered by Miller in Social Action. However, Tuomela’s notion is weaker in that there is no need for a collective end; all that is required is that each performs the action in part for the reason that the others do (p.92).

Tuomela’s central notion of a social practice presupposes so-called we-attitudes, such as intentions or beliefs that are the objects of mutual belief among those who possess them. Tuomela offers a useful taxonomy of we-attitudes, highlighting stronger and weaker versions of shared intentions and the like (Chapter 2).

Note that Tuomela distinguishes between we-attitudes and I-attitudes (individual attitudes). The former involve collective commitment and thinking from the collective’s perspective; apparently they are also objective and public, as opposed to subjective and private (pp.31-2, p.36 and p.144). So we-attitudes are not simply a species of I-attitudes; they are qualitatively different. Presumably, therefore, we-attitudes cannot be reduced to I-attitudes, or so Tuomela seems to think.

Here one might take issue with Tuomela and regard we-intentions and acting from the collective’s perspective or as a member of a group (pp.37-39), as notions that can be given an individualist treatment. Certainly, the view that I-attitudes involve only actions directed to the individual’s own actions or benefit is unduly restrictive. An individualist in the required sense can perfectly well admit the actions and benefits of others - indeed the moral values or principles of all in the group including him/herself - in the content of his or her intentions or beliefs. By parity of reasoning, individualists can offer individualist accounts of notions such as an individual acting as a member of a group. On the other hand, Tuomela has put forward more elaborate general counterarguments that are germane to this issue (p.57f).

Most theorists would accept that social institutions are constructions out of more basic notions; Tuomela opts for the more basic notion of a social practice as his building block. By “social institutions”, Tuomela means complex social forms, such as money, marriage and property regimes, that involve normative phenomena such as social status and associated rights and duties. On Tuomela’s account, social institutions conceptually depend on collective acceptance in the sense of shared we-attitudes; his is a collective acceptance theory. This is a version of the view espoused by Searle in his The Construction of Social Reality. However, Tuomela’s version is more detailed, especially in relation to the key issue of what is to count as collective acceptance (p.136f). It is important here to stress that the critical notion of collective acceptance in relation to social institutions is one involving we-attitudes and not simply I-attitudes.

A contrasting view in the literature to the collective acceptance view is a non-constructivist teleological view (see Miller Social Action), according to which there are pre-existing ends or goals which are also (real or imagined) human and collective goods (e.g. law and order, material well-being, knowledge). On the latter kind of view, institutional roles and tasks, and specifically institutional rights and duties, are in part derived from the (real or imagined) human good which is the point of the institution (and in part derived from human rights and the like, which ideally act as side constraints); it is not simply a matter of collective acceptance of otherwise unmotivated roles, goals, rights and duties. Note that on this teleological view a social institution which failed to deliver the good it purported to deliver or which delivered an outcome which was falsely believed to be a good, would be deficient qua social institution. Tuomela appears at times to endorse the central plank of this teleological view (p.157-158). Indeed, he speaks of an institution being “functionally successful” (p.171) when it achieves a solution it purports to provide. Moreover, he accepts that there are some institutions (viz. organisations) that have goals that in part define them. To this extent he must accept a teleological dimension of at least some social institutions. So a question arises as to whether Tuomela is opting for a hybrid model; part collectivist acceptance, part teleological.

Here I make three points. First, Tuomela makes it clear that his commitment to the collective-acceptance view prevents him from embracing the proposition that social institutions that are not also organisations have a defining telos which is some (real or imagined) collective good. In the end, social institutions that are not also organisations exist simply as a matter of collective acceptance, and the fact that they might provide (real or imagined) collective goods is not even in part definitional of them. Consider in this connection languages or systems of exchange which might not involve organisations; surely they serve our collective communicative and other purposes, notwithstanding the absence of an organisation. Second, in the case of social institutions which are also organisations, Tuomela’s official general account in terms merely of collective acceptance is inadequate; for ends or goals are, it turns out, in part definitive. Third, and more generally, collective-acceptance accounts appear to put the cart before the horse. It is not that we have social institutions because we agree with, or simply acquiesce in, their existence; rather we have established and continue to maintain social institutions because we have pre-existing human and social needs for various collective goods that they can and do fulfill.

Throughout this book Tuomela offers elaborate taxonomies and analyses of the various concepts and phenomena he is concerned to illuminate. Moreover, he discusses a number of important issues that I have not mentioned, such as the relationships between social practices in his sense, rule following and our application of concepts to the world; and their implications for questions of logical priority in regard to thought, language and action.

All in all, The Philosophy of Social Practices is a detailed and sophisticated treatment of some of our most central social action concepts, and is a useful addition to the philosophical literature.